Dimitri Ginev, Hermeneutic Realism: Reality Within Scientific Inquiry

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Dimitri Ginev, Hermeneutic Realism: Reality Within Scientific Inquiry, Springer, 2016, 291pp., $119.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319392875.

Reviewed by Trish Glazebrook, Washington State University


When Dimitri Ginev left a career in pharmacobiochemistry to avoid experimenting on animals, he was not at all happy with the state of philosophy of science that had displaced 'mirror of nature' approaches by means of structuralist tendencies that make reality 'a prisoner of formal semantics.' (xi) His book is a tour de force that answers back to this either/or of metaphysical realism versus constructivism, subjectivism and relativism. That is, Ginev manages to 'save the phenomena' using the logic of scientific inquiry itself without recourse to either transcendental subjectivity or raw, empirical data. He does this by appropriating representation, reality and objectivity into hermeneutic realism in a discussion that takes nothing for granted. This is no simple task -- it requires accounting for a mass of authors and positions while providing a positive agenda that adapts well-established concepts and language in realism debates into a new and innovative articulation of scientific inquiry. The book is the culmination of a long-standing, mature research program that delivers its account of what hermeneutic realism is through intense engagement with positions that hermeneutic realism is not -- neither sociology of scientific knowledge (SSK), nor science and technology studies (STS), nor traditional literary or scientific hermeneutics. It is thus a complex book that successfully details and defends hermeneutic realism while its reader is constantly at risk of falling back into the meanings and concepts the analyses are intended to displace.

The Preface opens with Ginev's promise to defend not just the standard view that scientific inquiry is an interpretive constitution of meaning that enables hermeneutic realism, but the stronger thesis that the facticity of scientific inquiry 'brings to the fore that mode of reality's being which affords the formulation and the advocacy of hermeneutic realism.' (vii) That is, hermeneutic realism as an account of the meaningfulness of science arises from the very nature of scientific inquiry. Ginev promises to make this argument in four chapters. The first will discuss the unity of meaningful articulation and objectification in scientific inquiry. The second will recast focal issues in scientific realism debates hermeneutically using Fleck's strategy of genealogizing scientific facts. The next will adumbrate a hermeneutic-realist program for philosophy of science by addressing the interpretive fore-structuring of objectified factuality within the facticity of inquiry. Because the book as a whole is guided by Ginev's claim that articulated meaning and procedural objectification in the facticity of inquiry 'textualize' domains of reality disclosed by scientific practice, the final chapter will detail and analyze the concepts of 'text' and 'textualizing' that are prominent in hermeneutic realism.

The book fulfills these promises. Interestingly, however, it does so in five, not the promised four, chapters. This makes the book extremely hard to talk about in the context of the Preface's promises as the chapter undiscussed in the Preface is the book's third chapter. It provides 'Intermediate Reflections' on 'Reflexivity in Scientific Inquiry and Empirical Ontologies of Hybrid Objects.' The first chapter establishes that the 'primary unit[s] of scientific inquiry' are not independent, bounded, property-carrying objects but 'phenomena that embrace and internalize the procedures of objectification.' (38) That is, scientific objects are not objects of thought but objects of equipment-based study and experiment. Quantum physics provides an example of the 'entanglement of instrumental contextures with contexts of inquiry.' (45) Entanglement is the dependence of the context of inquiry on the equipment that affords that context, and the dependence of the equipment's usefulness on what context of inquiry determines worth investigating. The second chapter provides further analysis of entanglement and reflexivity, i.e. the scientist's capacity to reflect on entanglement and understand the interrelationship between practices of inquiry and the horizon of possible inquiries. This problem is that this sounds much like a case of Derrida's bottomless chessboard in which scientific inquiry would be a rule-governed concretion of activity extended over nothing. Against this perspective, 'saving the phenomenon,' i.e. establishing that scientific objects are not random fabrications in self-enclosed thought-systems, would entail a retreat into empirical ontology -- a dead-end for any 'logic of practice' or 'horizon of possibilities' that the hermeneutic realist may wish to deploy.

The 'Intermediate Reflections' accordingly provide Ginev's argument against empirical objectivity: you simply cannot build scientific objects out of the perspectives of all participants in inquiry. Ginev understands that the point of attempts at intersubjective object-constitution is to escape relativist-epistemological perspectivalism by retaining the unity of the network, and he too holds that science must be understood always as science-in-practice; but his hermeneutic realism cannot accept that objects of scientific inquiry are limited to participant perspectives. This is too close to constructivist accounts that he rejects for two reasons. First, constructivism does not save the phenomena because it reduces scientific objects to human projection. Secondly, it reduces the sciences to relativism that makes research vulnerable to political appropriation. Scientific knowledge has, of course, always been appropriable. The 1984 Hastings Report advocated corporate funding to prevent science being co-opted by government, but tobacco advocacy and climate denial have shown that corporate appropriation is also a threat. Ginev locates the autonomy of scientific inquiry, however, in the interplay between horizons of inquiry and practices of inquiry, i.e. in the entanglement of inquiry and equipment and the reflexivity of scientific practices. This move does not prevent instrumental use of scientific insights, but it does mean that scientific inquiry itself is not inherently driven by special interests. This move also sets the stage for the next chapter insofar as the autonomy of scientific inquiry opens the possibility of a logic in inquiry within which scientists enact the interplay of the 'endogenous reflexivity' between horizons of possibilities and the 'inescapable locality' of research.

The chapter following the 'Intermediate Reflections' is a kind of radicalization of the second chapter. The second chapter appropriated terms like 'objective' and 'reality' into hermeneutic realism, but this chapter provides full-blown analysis of hermeneutic realism in terms of 'meaningful articulation' and 'objectification of reality.' The second chapter achieved its goal of 'putting practices first,' (68) while this chapter aims to reconcile an infinite horizon of possibilities for knowledge production with 'the inescapable locality of the actions and activities of scientific inquiry' (188) by examining the 'immanent "hermeneutic logic" of scientific practices' interrelatedness.' (183) Ginev argues that hermeneutic realism takes scientific practices to disclose and articulate (but not cause) domains of reality guided by an endogenous reflexivity, i.e. internal play between an infinite horizon of possibilities for inquiry and a practice that makes inquiry possible by means of equipmental arrangements that structure in advance and limit what questions are to be asked. Because this interplay belongs to the autonomous, endogenous logic of scientific inquiry rather than Kantian transcendental subjectivity, scientific objects are not reduced to human projection. Ginev's hermeneutic realism accordingly creates an innovative path between holding that scientific inquiry describes a reality independent of human understanding and settling for science as trivial in its accomplishments (i.e. limited to insights like 'fire burns,' or 'at least all swans so far are white') or simply fanciful (e.g. phlogiston, caloric, phrenology).

In the chapter 'Intermediate Reflections', 'object' appears in the title, but 'objectivity' appears not at all, and 'objectification' only twice. First, it figures in the claim that radical reflexivity (i.e. the call to examine assumptions underlying the procedural objectification of things understood as facts) deconstructs the constant presence of objects taken as facts. (165) Secondly, Ginev argues that documentation in research reveals not just what is intentionally documented, but the horizon of possibilities that fore-structures production of what is documented. (175) The index, which is overall sadly thin, lists the entire subsequent chapter as one of the entries for 'objectification.' This subsequent chapter uses these two points from the 'Intermediate Reflections' as a basis for its 'objectification of reality' that does not take objects as facts about the world but as constituted in factuality, i.e. the materiality of research, and documented in facticity, i.e. a horizon of possibilities in which a particular set of questions can be asked. This chapter could not radicalize the second chapter without the base provided by the 'Intermediate Reflections' that must have been added after the Preface was written. I take it then that reflexivity and documentation as a reflexive practice are crucial aspects of making hermeneutic realism hermeneutic rather than simply realism.

These claims in the 'Intermediate Reflections' also return in the final chapter, which seems an add-on, given its brevity. After two hundred and fifty pages of hermeneutic realism, however, attention must finally turn to hermeneutic realism. The discussion of 'texts' and textuality -- a difference that has played throughout the book as Ginev's ontological difference -- is now put in head-on engagement with Heidegger. Ginev argues that according to the hermeneutic realist texts do not create contexts; rather 'textualizing,' i.e. the activities and practices of revealing scientific objects in contexts of inquiry, constitutes both the 'text' (what is being interpreted) and the context (e.g. readable technologies and non-Cartesian representations such as measurements, tables, etc.). Ginev openly embraces deconstruction but tempers it with hermeneutics: the 'bottomless chessboard' of deconstruction collapses the distinction between texts and contexts; hermeneutics restores this distinction 'without making concessions to the metaphysics of presence.' (269) Ginev can thus have his cake and eat it too: the hermeneutic realist needs neither metaphysical realism to give objects of scientific inquiry a life of their own, nor a res cogitans to ground the logic of inquiry. Scientists in this account are brilliant, imaginative builders of spaces of inquiry, yet flies-on-the-wall that forever maintain, extend, and re-appropriate their walls. The hermeneutic realist accordingly saves the phenomena at some sacrifice to the significance of the scientist.

Against this sacrifice, one of the highlights of the book is Ginev's account in the second chapter of what it looks like when objects of situated inquiry realize their transcendence and move across scientific domains, even opening new ones. It is a case-study of the role of chemiosmotic theory in articulation of the domain of vectorial metabolism, and the impacts of this articulation into bioenergetics and enzymology. This real page-turner tracks the movement of concepts through transformative openings of possibilities between practices and horizons of inquiry that are each multi-stable in their flexibility. It's a lively demonstration of how hermeneutic realism can make sense of the history of science. More importantly for Ginev's purposes, it enacts the full story of hermeneutic realism by showing how particular insights of specific researchers move the logic of scientific inquiry. The scientist does then remain significant in Ginev's hermeneutic realism: the scientist's role is to enact and thus move forward the logic of scientific inquiry by articulating what inquiry that logic makes possible.

This difficult and complex book is distractingly and irritatingly replete with half-page footnotes and many-lined parenthetical additions, and has the virtue-cum-vice, like many non-trivial contributions to the histories of both science and philosophy, of appearing completely obvious once you've read it. For example, Ginev does not so much reject causality as, analogizing to quantum non-locality, make it redundant by explaining the endogenous reflexivity of scientific inquiry in terms of entanglement (and therefore complementarity) between how inquiry articulates its objects (the hermeneutic-as) and how these objects are disclosed (the apophantic-as). In other words, how objects of scientific inquiry are seen entails how they are described, and how they are described entails the way inquiry is structured to make them visible. Arrangements of instruments in laboratories are similarly entangled with contexts of inquiry. To make an extremely long story short, the material aspects of inquiry (not just labs and equipment but also outputs like measurements and graphs, for example) structure spaces of inquiry that fore-structure scientific articulations of meaning, while at the same time, such articulations fore-structure the spatial aspects of inquiry. 'Space' must be understood here not just physically -- physical and conceptual space constitute a single spatiality for research, as for example this review is inseparably both letters and concepts, even if read in a virtual format. Hermeneutic realism rejects the idea that scientific research reduces to human subjectivity. It accepts neither a doubling of reality into pre-scientific experience and scientific objectivity, as in phenomenology's natural versus theoretical attitude, nor a denial that scientific inquiry can be objective. Rather, science is an articulation of meaningful reality.

Ginev's accomplishment is to show that the situatedness of inquiry does not entail that 'anything goes.' The endogenous reflexivity of science drives a process of self-correction and improvement, he argues. His is not instrumental realism, however, because 'improvement' does not intend more accurate 'mirrors of nature,' but flexible and changing horizons that extend or open (or both) exciting, rich domains of inquiry and enable their meaningful articulation. So theoretically, anything is possible; but 'situated transcendence' constrains scientific inquiry through its internal logic of tension between horizons of possible inquiry and the rendering concrete of possibilities in practice. Scientific objects can accordingly be unruly and boisterously transcend their situatedness (Venus in retrograde, for example, or 'recalcitrant data'), so are not inherently confinable to any particular practice or domain of inquiry; yet their situatedness in a particular practice nonetheless localizes inquiry in a horizon of meaningful articulation. Given that objects of inquiry cannot therefore exist outside fore-structured inquiry, the question remains, despite whatever flexibility is possible across such fore-structuring, how are the objects of scientific inquiry, even when multi-stable across inquirers, not just intersubjective projections that are subject to the metaphysics of presence entailed in coherence if not correspondence theories of truth? Even if objects are represented in non-Cartesian 'contextures-of-equipment,' has hermeneutic realism successfully appropriated objectivity so as to avoid being consumed by inter-subjective projection on one hand, or falling into Cartesian dualism into on the other?

In closing, there are myriad questions to be posed to Ginev once this excellent and thoroughly interesting book is digested -- whether Heidegger could be so easily dismissed were Ginev to read beyond Sein und Zeit, for example, and where Aristotle fits into all this. Indeed, the book's fascination does not end on the final page; rather, the many possibilities for re-thinking that it demands seem endless. This book should be read by anyone interested in the history or philosophy of science, SSK, STS, or hermeneutics. Social scientists interested in the ontology of culture will also find much of interest. Indeed, Ginev can successfully draw so substantially on ethnomethodology in his analysis not just because some thinkers undertake fieldwork in SSK by bringing sociological and ethnographic methods of data collection into working labs, but because labs are always already cultures. The problem of reality is no more a challenge for the scientist than for anyone articulating a space of lived experience while living in (and as) an articulation of human experience. Finally, Ginev is to be thanked for citing dozens of women's work and deeply engaging women's contributions.