Direct Belief: An Essay on the Semantics, Pragmatics, and Metaphysics of Belief

Placeholder book cover

Jonathan Berg, Direct Belief: An Essay on the Semantics, Pragmatics, and Metaphysics of Belief, de Gruyter, 2012, 157pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781614510826.

Reviewed by Philipp Koralus, Washington University in St. Louis


Jonathan Berg's short and well-organized book Direct Belief attacks a foundational problem in the philosophy of language: making sense of the semantics and pragmatics of belief reports, and of how those reports relate to the content of beliefs.

It is notoriously hard to give an account of belief reports that captures all robust intuitions systematically. For example, there is an intuition that a report like 'John believes that Mary smokes' in a neutral context can simply convey that the individual Mary is believed by John to have the property of smoking. There is also a strong intuition that 'Lois believes that Superman is a reporter' is false, while 'Lois believes that Clark Kent is a reporter' is true. 'Clark Kent' and 'Superman' denote the same (fictional) individual, so it is not obvious how the two reports support different truth-values. Moreover, intuitions subtly depend on the context of utterance. If we focus on how good Superman was at setting up his cover identity, 'The cunning hero even made Lois believe that Superman is a reporter!' suddenly seems true.

Berg, like many contemporary theorists, takes the view that the semantic contribution of a proper name just is its referent. His main positive project is to reconcile direct reference with linguistic intuitions about belief reports seemingly in conflict with it, relying on Gricean conversational implicatures. However, Berg's project goes beyond language. He also defends the view that belief contents themselves are directly referential, which leads to an account of how to distinguish the behavioral effects of Lois' Superman beliefs from those of her Clark Kent beliefs. In a welcome manner, this sets Berg's discussion apart from those entirely focused on semantics and pragmatics.

A classical move in response to the data just discussed is to say that sentences reporting on beliefs semantically contribute ways of representing individuals (e.g., in a superhero manner or in a nerdy-reporter manner), via some form of indexicality or ambiguity, or by leaving a 'gap' in the semantics. Berg argues against these approaches in Chapter 1.

Considering how much ink has been spilled on indexicality and ambiguity approaches, Berg's critical discussion of them is somewhat underdeveloped for a monograph. I will take one of the main arguments against ambiguity analyses as an example, since its details bear on Berg's defense of his own proposal in an unexpected way that I will turn to later. As various authors have pointed out, ambiguous constituents do not allow for "crossed interpretations" (Zwicky and Sadock 1975, Atlas 1977). For example, 'Jack and Jill began to cry' can be interpreted as having Jack and Jill both shouting or both weeping, but not as having Jack weeping and Jill shouting. If belief reports are ambiguous between, say, directly referential interpretations and different interpretations involving special ways of representing individuals, we should not be able to assign crossed interpretations to them. Berg suggests that we can in fact assign crossed interpretations of this sort to belief reports, offering 'I believe that Superman is a reporter, and so does Lois (though she wouldn't put it in those words)'. However, the truth of this sentence does not depend on a crossed interpretation, as Berg seems to acknowledge, so it is puzzling that there is no further search for better test cases (I suggest some in Koralus 2012).

In Chapter 2, Berg defends the view that belief-report sentences semantically contribute no special machinery to distinguish Lois' Superman beliefs from her Clark Kent beliefs. In fact, 'Lois believes that Clark Kent can fly' is simply true, on Berg's view: Lois' belief is an unmediated relation between her and the individual variously denoted by 'Clark' and 'Superman'. Intuitions to the contrary are to be explained by an account of what attitude reports can conversationally implicate.

Berg proposes that Grice's first maxim of Quantity, "Make your contribution as informative as is required (for the current purposes of the exchange)," yields the

Principle of Implicated Normalcy: Speakers generally conversationally implicate that the circumstances regarding whatever they are speaking of are not abnormal in any significant, unanticipated, unindicated way (58).

For example, this principle is intended to yield the following implicature pattern.

(1)        The waiter brought me my hamburger very soon after I ordered it.

(1')        ~> The hamburger was not delivered encased in a cubic yard of solid Lucite plastic so rigid that it takes a jack hammer to break it open.

How does this bear on belief reports? Berg takes it as "an obvious fact" that the target of a correct belief report would normally be prepared to accept the report verbatim (61). Given the principle of implicated normalcy, an utterance of a belief report then implicates, among other things, that the subject of the report would accept the report verbatim.

(2)         Lois believes that Superman is a reporter

(2')        ~> Lois would accept (2) verbatim.

On Berg's view, (2) seems false because it carries the false conversational implicature that Lois would accept (2) verbatim. In a context that focuses the conversation on Lois' being fooled about Superman's identity, this implicature can be defeated. If Lois does not speak English, normalcy, as understood by Berg, requires acceptability in an appropriate translation. If Lois does not have language, normalcy requires that that she would manifest appropriate behavioral patterns.

Setting aside whatever worries one might have about individuating interpretations of belief reports via dispositions to verbal or other behavior, a problem faced by any account that appeals to pure direct reference semantics plus implicatures emerges from cases like (3):

(3)        Lois does not believe that Superman is Clark Kent.

(3')       Lois believes that Superman is not Clark Kent.

Direct reference semantics makes (3) and (3') false, but they clearly seem true. Berg holds that "one reason these sentences seem true is simply that in uttering them we would normally implicate something that is true, viz., that [3] is acceptable verbatim. Moreover, they are the negations of sentences that are typically used to convey -- and hence, that seem to express -- something false" (71).

The discussion would have to be expanded considerably to make it convincing that Berg's proposal does not overgenerate, even if we restrict ourselves to his own examples. Imagine our waiter in (1) has immediately thrown the burger in the trash after receiving it from the kitchen, which is how he proceeds with half of his orders (say, out of anger at the employment opportunities for educated young people in a depressed economy). In this case, the semantic content of (1) is false. However, the putative normalcy implicature is true, since the burger's being in the trash prevents it from being delivered in a Lucite plastic casing. Moreover, the negation of (1) would naturally give rise to the false implicature that the burger was delivered late (rather than never). Berg should clarify why (1) still just seems plain false, in light of his account of (3). A well-known key challenge for a pragmatic account of belief reports is precisely to find principles powerful enough to handle cases like (3) without overgenerating. Berg does not provide enough reasons to believe that he can meet this challenge.

On Berg's view, Quantity implicatures have to be able to make utterances that are false as a matter of semantics seem true. A convincing way to argue for a possibility claim is to produce compelling examples. Again, what the reader is offered is plainly too brief. Setting aside belief reports, the main putative case Berg mentions in which an utterance that is false as a matter of semantic content robustly seems true because of true pragmatic content involves metaphor. Imagine that Illana is an 8-year old making her little siblings march in file, tolerating no complaints.

(4)        Illana is a real drill sergeant!

(4')       Illana is not a real drill sergeant!

Berg suggests that the pragmatic content "Illana is very strict" drives the intuition that (4) is true, even though the semantic content "Illana is a ranking member of the armed forces" is false. We naturally take (4') to express the negation of what Berg would take to be a pragmatically conveyed claim of strictness. Berg proposes that the negation in (3) functions similarly.

Why should evidence from metaphor be taken to support claims that are ultimately about Quantity implicatures? As promised, the data from Chapter 1 offered against ambiguity theories becomes relevant again in a surprising way, though not in way helpful to Berg. Cases like (4) notoriously fail to support the crossed interpretations that Berg takes as evidence in favor of a pragmatic account of belief reports. Consider (5), assuming that Ermey is supremely lenient for a United States Marine Corps drill instructor:

(5)        Illana is a real drill sergeant, and so is Staff Sergeant Ermey.

The crossed interpretation necessary to make (5) true seems to be blocked. This kind of data has been used to argue that metaphorical interpretations are reflected in the grammar, unlike mere implicatures, which would make it less surprising that negation can scope over metaphorical interpretations of embedded clauses (Stern 2000). Thus, the features that make metaphor interesting to Berg are plausibly the features that distinguish metaphor from the sorts of implicatures that are Berg's real concern.

One way to avoid some of the foregoing problems would be to say that the semantic contribution of (3) simply does not encode a complete proposition and that what we evaluate for truth or falsity in (3) only emerges after a contribution from pragmatics. This would eliminate the need to argue that belief reports that seem clearly true are in some sense "really" false as a matter of semantics (Soames 2005). However, Berg insists that no departure from the classical picture is needed.

In the third and final chapter, Berg considers how the issues raised in the previous chapters relate to the nature of belief. Lois believes that there are two individuals, one of whom is called 'Superman' and one of whom is called 'Clark Kent', even though there is only one relevant individual s. Berg notes that Lois has two conceptions of this individual. What is the nature of those conceptions? The bulk of the chapter is devoted to arguments against what he calls the Medium View, according to which conceptions belong to a medium in which beliefs are held. For example, if we take it that Lois' conceptions have something to do with different types of mental representations via which she gets to have her beliefs about s, just as she has different names to talk about s, we are adopting a Medium View of conceptions. Against the Medium View, Berg wants to maintain the Theory of Direct Belief, according to which a belief about an individual is a direct relation between a believer and an individual, unmediated by notions, guises, or modes of presentation.

How do we make sense of the fact that Lois has multiple distinct conceptions of the same individual? Berg proposes the Higher Order View of conceptions. A conception "is a set of predicates (or properties) that one believes are jointly instantiated," which can be thought of as files or dossiers (113). In addition to her direct beliefs, Lois has a Superman conception and a Clark Kent conception. On Berg's view, believing the existential generalization "there are two distinct individuals, one of whom is called 'Superman', wears a cape, flies, etc., the other of whom is called 'Clark Kent', wears a suit, works as a reporter, etc.  . . .  is alone enough to account for her having these two conceptions." (113) On this view, conceptions are cashed out in terms of beliefs.

Berg proposes that the Higher Order View allows the Theory of Direct Belief to make sense of how Lois behaves differently when she believes that Superman is in front of her compared to when she believes that Clark Kent is in front of her. Ordinarily, when Lois believes that Superman is in front of her, she also believes that the person in front of her is an individual that instantiates the properties in her Superman conception, which, say, may be the sorts of properties inducing her to try to kiss that individual. In a different case, when she believes that Clark Kent is in front of her, she also believes that the person in front of her is an individual that instantiates the properties in her Clark Kent conception, which may not induce the same behavior.

It is slightly frustrating that the presentation of this crucial part of Berg's proposal does not include a more systematic discussion of potential worries it may generate. It is hard to see how the proposal avoids what one might call the Problem of Unstable Conceptions. Suppose Lois sees a picture of Superman on her left and a picture of Clark Kent on her right. If Direct Belief theory is not artificially limited in scope, we want to say that Lois believes that s is on the left and she believes that s is on the right. On Berg's view, she presumably also believes that there is someone on the left called 'Superman'. Nobody else is on the left, so she should be able to infer that s is called 'Superman'. Similarly, Lois presumably believes that there is someone on the right called 'Clark Kent' so she should be able to infer that s is called 'Clark Kent', since nobody else is on the right. Now, what keeps Lois from putting the belief that s is on the left together with her belief that s is called 'Clark Kent', to conclude that there is someone on the left called 'Clark Kent'? A successful account of conceptions should explain why Lois could not reason her way to this conclusion. It is hard to see how one could provide such an explanation on Berg's account.

A nearby alternative view would take the "file" metaphor more seriously. We could say that all of our beliefs about individuals are underwritten by file cards that directly refer to individuals and that have entries for all properties that these individuals putatively instantiate. Without realizing it, we could have multiple file cards referring to the same individual, with different properties recorded on them. Formally, we could think of a file card as akin to an existential generalization about jointly instantiated properties, with the additional rider that the generalization is only satisfiable by a particular object in the domain of a model. In other words, we are adding a "referential anchor" for the variable. This alternative view eliminates the problem of unstable conceptions but requires more machinery for conceptions than existential generalizations. A very detailed articulation of a Higher Order View of conceptions along these lines, unmentioned by Berg, was developed by Asher (1986) to account for the interpretation of belief reports. The latter account has its own problems (Koralus 2012), but Berg makes it hard to see if he has a viable alternative.

Jonathan Berg's book has many virtues. The division into chapters focusing on semantics, pragmatics, and the metaphysics of belief is helpful and his discussion touches on several important issues in contemporary theorizing about belief reports. The book is clear and streamlined, making for a less grueling read than most monographs in the philosophy of language. But I fear what may be offering respite here is that the devil is in the details. Considering that the primary readership will consist of specialists, many crucial junctures are almost daringly brief.


Asher, N. (1986). "Belief in discourse representation theory." Journal of Philosophical Logic 15(2), 127-189.

Atlas, J. (1977). "Negation, ambiguity, and presupposition." Linguistics and Philosophy 1(3), 321-336.

Koralus, P. (2012). "The open instruction theory of attitude reports and the pragmatics of answers." Philosopher's Imprint, 12(14).

Stern, J. (2000). Metaphor in Context. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Soames, S. (2005). "Naming and Asserting." In: Z. Szabo (ed.), Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Zwicky, A.M., and Sadock, J.M. (1975). "Ambiguity tests and how to fail them." In: J.P. Kimball (ed.), Syntax and Semantics 4, New York: Academic Press.