Disability in Practice: Attitudes, Policies, and Relationships

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Adam Cureton and Thomas E. Hill, Jr. (eds), Disability in Practice: Attitudes, Policies, and Relationships, Oxford University Press, 2018, 249pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812876.

Reviewed by Linda Barclay, Monash University


As the editors, Adam Cureton and Thomas E. Hill, Jr. suggest, the highlights of this excellent collection are the essays that deal explicitly with our complex attitudes to disability and how they affect our relationships and our medical, reproductive and parenting practices. These essays make up the first two sections of the book. The essays in the third section move beyond this theme, addressing more established debates about justice and moral status: Lawrence C. Becker extends his existing theory of habilitation to disability; Samuel Freeman defends Rawls's contractarian framework from well-known criticisms that it does not include or respect people with severe cognitive disabilities; Richard Galvin engages with debates about moral status; and Virginia L. Warren discusses the 'moral disabilities' that can impair a person's ability to live a full moral life, although her chapter has very little to do with disability as usually conceived.

As it is not possible to discuss all of the contributions in a short review, I'll concentrate on the first two sections, which contain some of the more innovative and original contributions to the ever-expanding philosophical literature on disability.

J. David Velleman and David Sussman both attempt to make sense of common attitudes to disability that on the face of it look inconsistent. Specifically, they both defend the attitudes of would-be parents who believe they should avoid having a disabled child, despite the fact that we know that disabled people value their own lives and are loved and cherished by their parents who do not regret having them. Velleman argues that disabled people rightly reject the view that circumstances like theirs provide reasons to choose voluntary assisted suicide. But he disagrees that it follows from this that disability is also not a good reason to choose an abortion, even though the same demeaning attitude might seem to be involved in both cases, namely, that the life of a disabled person is not worth living. Both respect for persons and love allow us to distinguish between the two cases: respect for persons does not require us to bring someone into existence, although it may require that we do not bring some people into existence, and we can only love someone we know, who therefore must already exist. We can and should respect and love existing disabled people, without this entailing any corresponding condemnation of selective abortion of disabled foetuses. Echoing many critiques of the so-called 'expressivist argument' against the abortion of disabled foetuses, Velleman denies that choosing to abort such foetuses implies that the lives of existing disabled people are not worth living.

Sussman addresses a closely related apparent anomaly in our attitudes to disability: namely, that we believe we should avoid deliberately creating a disabled child (all things considered), yet we value the lives of such children once they exist and do not regret having them. Sussman argues that it can make sense for parents of a disabled child to affirm their decision to have that child, even though at the time their decision was not justified. Appealing to a complex account of love, and the way in which the needs and demands of one's disabled child are incorporated into one's sense of self, Sussman argues that from their current standpoint, the love parents have for their children prevents them from genuinely forming the belief that those children should not have been brought into existence, making regret for their existence impossible. One of the most important upshots of Sussman's and Velleman's arguments, if successful, is this: to some extent, we can account for these common attitudes to disability without having to determine whether disability is bad or merely different. That has been a fruitful and important debate in its own right, but love, respect and the complexity of reproductive decision-making are independent factors that can also make sense of, and justify, such attitudes.

Richard Dean agrees with Velleman that seeking to prevent or cure a disability does not necessarily send a disrespectful message. His focus is on the attempt to cure autism, which he denies need send such a message. While he argues that it is not unreasonable for neurodiversity advocates to resist the search for a cure for autism, he rejects some of their specific reasons for doing so, such as that concerning disrespectful messaging. He also reaches the rather uncontroversial conclusion that if curing autism involves altering fundamental elements of a person's identity then it should be something they choose, a requirement that obviously does not apply to foetuses and very young children who do not possess the relevant sense of identity. Dean suggests that these conclusions hinge on believing there is some kind of difference between autism and, say, being gay, for which the search for a cure and even the voluntary choice to change, would be deemed highly suspect. He proposes that whether we can identify relevant differences between these cases will depend on whether the familiar social model or medical model of disability offers the most plausible analysis of autism. He explores this via Anita Silvers' 'historical counterfactualizing' test. There has been considerable discussion of both the various models of disability and of Silvers' historical counterfactualizing test, but they are not developed further by Dean in this paper. Elizabeth Barnes has developed new and influential arguments about whether and how we can think of disability as distinct from something like being gay; engagement with her work might have been fruitful here.

In discussing the case of a newly disabled man who refuses life-saving treatment, Andrew M. Courtwright outlines how clinicians would determine whether or not the patient has the capacity to make an autonomous decision, focussing on the reasonableness of his beliefs, the coherence of his desires with what he "really" wants, and whether the decision is stable over time. He argues however that once we appreciate that autonomy is a property not only of specific decisions but more broadly of persons, then clinicians can have greater obligations to a patient than merely respecting his autonomous decision. These might include ongoing discussions with the patient about his decision, the alleviation of conditions that are impairing decision making capacity, and the responsibility to seek the best surrogate decision makers for patients likely to continue to lose capacity.

The articles by Adam Cureton and Karen Stohr are highlights of the collection. They vividly illuminate the complex nature of social exchanges between people who do and don't have disabilities, and how these social exchanges can profoundly shape the course of a person's life. They offer insight into fundamental ethical issues that philosophers have largely neglected.

Cureton addresses why some people with imperceptible disabilities might wish to pass as nondisabled, and analyses the costs and benefits of attempting to do so. The costs can be enormous, as shown by Cureton's description of Scott, a man who is blind but not obviously so to others. To pass, Scott might have to forgo adaptive equipment, important accommodations, social opportunities, assistance from friends and colleagues, and professional engagements. Importantly, he is likely to also have to engage in day-to-day deceptions, deflections, and extensive planning to carry it all off. The kind of vigilance required sounds frankly exhausting. Yet Cureton provides an equally compelling account of why Scott and other disabled people might choose to pass. Extensive negative attitudes can seep into every interaction, in both subtle and not-so-subtle ways. Cureton, who is blind, notices that some people are more likely to ignore him, or be stand-offish and awkward. Alternatively, they might be preoccupied with his disability and its workings, intruding, offending and irritating, without necessarily meaning to. Worse still, they might stare and ridicule, and assume he is less capable than he actually is across a wide range of social, professional and personal contexts. Cureton offers no definitive conclusions as to whether a person ought to try to pass: the wisdom of doing so will often depend on the particulars of each person's circumstances. However, with tact, he does acknowledge some of the additional moral costs involved in passing, including the possibility of perpetuating such negative attitudes in avoiding a direct confrontation with them. It struck me how apt his insights about passing would be to people suffering from mental health issues.

Stohr's article is an excellent companion to Cureton's. She argues that social conventions of what we notice and do not notice about other people have significant moral implications insofar as they communicate moral attitudes. On the one hand, to be noticed appropriately is to have one's moral and social standing affirmed. To refuse to notice, to shun, is to convey that the target is not considered a full member of the relevant community, which denies her moral standing. Yet we can also be subject to inappropriate and disrespectful noticing. As Stohr argues, it is easy enough to assert that everyone should be noticed appropriately, but much more difficult to explain what that involves. As with Cureton' chapter, Stohr's arguments constitute a subtle and insightful analysis of some conventions of noticing, and their moral import. In particular, pretending not to notice some feature of the other enables us to mark out and maintain some boundaries in our interactions. Respect for others often requires that we keep our distance, a moral requirement that Cureton's own research has made especially vivid. Moral complexity arises when duties of love demand that conventions of pretending not to notice be suspended. Stohr also avoids the didactic, offering instead practical guidance on the kinds of considerations that might help us to find our way through competing moral concerns. She shows why this can be especially complex when we interact with others with whom we are unfamiliar, not only because they are strangers to us, but also because the facts of someone's disability may require an unfamiliar adaptation or application of noticing conventions.

Oliver Sensen offers a unified account of respect which covers a wide scope of potential recipients, including not only typical human beings, but also those with serious cognitive impairments, animals, the dead and even objects like flags. Such a unified account promises to be more inclusive, but achieves this by denying that respect must be a response to a third-personal feature of beings that are respect-worthy. Even a second-personal account of respect -- the recognition of the equal standing of others to make and respond to claims -- fails to be fully inclusive, excluding not only non-animate objects, but potentially also some severely cognitively impaired human beings. Sensen argues that we can instead think about the attitude that agents should have towards a wide-range of beings and objects, an attitude of observantia respect where one is humble, restricts or limits oneself in relation to them, and does not exalt oneself above others. He argues that every major outlook in normative ethics -- deontology, consequentialism and virtue ethics -- provides reasons for agents to adopt such an attitude of respect: it is arguably a feature of a virtuous, flourishing human being, is likely to lead to a better world, and partly for these reasons, is possibly somewhat innate. Which particular actions properly express this attitude of respect is again enormously complex to determine, depending on all kinds of empirical considerations to do with culture, circumstances, and what the object of respect is like.

Sensen only wishes to argue that the first-personal view of respect is the best option to justify a unified perspective of respect, not that it is a better account of respect than either the third- or second-personal accounts. However, one might question whether from the perspective of cognitive disability a pluralistic third-personal view of respect might be preferred over attempting such an ambitious unified account. What we are often encouraged to appreciate is precisely the value inherent in a person with serious disabilities, and in her relationships and activities. Given widespread scepticism that such individuals are bearers of significant value, some might consider it unsatisfactory to abandon these debates.

With its focus on common attitudes to disability, this volume makes a welcome and very significant addition to the disability literature. Most of the articles adopt an explicitly Kantian framework, which is unsurprising given the profile of the editors. One might have hoped for a broader representation than solely U.S. based scholars. Despite the tendency of some of the authors to refer to various conventions, norms and attitudes as common "in the U.S. and other Western countries", a broader sample of authors would likely have brought into sharp relief that in fact social conventions and attitudes can differ very significantly between "Western countries", let alone between Western and non-Western countries. I would also have liked a couple of the articles to engage more seriously with existing disability literature that extensively addresses the topics discussed, although this is of course a broader issue with the discipline itself.

One final observation. Some of the views defended or challenged in this volume are very dear to people, bound up not only with their deepest moral convictions, but also with their sense of identity and self-worth. Yet mutual respect and good-will prevail. One wonders why these virtues seem so difficult to adopt in some other contemporary debates that engage issues of justice and identity. Whatever the reasons, this is a great credit to both Cureton and Hill.