Disability with Dignity: Justice, Human Rights and Equal Status

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Linda Barclay, Disability with Dignity: Justice, Human Rights and Equal Status, Routledge, 2019, 142pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138498068.

Reviewed by John Vorhaus, University College London


This is a splendid book: written in bracing, plain English, it presents a conception of what a just society for people with disabilities might look like. Linda Barclay's aims are to establish 'the core entitlements of people with disabilities which are so flagrantly denied in the real world' and 'to make the best case possible for realising justice for people with disabilities' (4). She also makes out a case for the equal status of disabled people, and one of many distinguishing features of this volume is the attempt to justify and align both the entitlements and equal status that she maintains are possessed by all people, irrespective of any disability and its severity. The book combines impressive scholarship with a resolutely practical focus on the experience of injustice; it is packed with lucid argument -- no trace of obfuscation -- and proceeds by way of engagement with philosophy of disability, human rights law and some moral and political philosophy. The scope, acuity and consistently high standard of the arguments make this a work that anyone concerned about the conditions and rights of disabled people can learn a great deal from.

What are we offered? A discussion of conceptions and models of disability, resource and capability-based theories of justice, the place of human rights in distributive and capabilities justice, and an exploration of the significance of equal status and dignity in accounts of the right to vote and interpersonal interactions. Barclay has interesting and valuable things to say about all of these subjects, and offers trenchant criticism of many of the best-known philosophical accounts of them; it all adds up to a significant contribution to the philosophy of disability, and to a host of related discussions in moral and political philosophy. There is, indeed, much more here than I can write about; I will say rather more about dignity and moral status than about rights and distributive justice.

One strikingly original claim is that we can rely exclusively neither on an appeal to human rights, nor on the claims of distributive justice, to establish justice for disabled people: we need both, as illustrated in Barclays' illuminating analysis of the Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (CRPD), and her arguments for CRPD-sponsored rights to participation and access. She makes a persuasive argument for this hybrid view. It is a particularly strong feature of the book that Barclay is on top of recent human rights legislation. Like the writings of Anita Silvers before her, this work illustrates how important it is that philosophers who write about justice for people with disabilities have a good working knowledge of disability-related legislation.

In keeping with her practical aspirations, Barclay looks for a conception of disability that will assist in the cause of promoting justice, and she puts to work, to good effect, a criterion for determining an adequate conception that is neither over- nor under-inclusive; several well-known definitions deservedly fare poorly under this test. She has a good argument, too, about the methodological order of priorities, recommending the reverse of common practice: it is not conceptions of disability that determine claims of justice, but assumptions about justice that largely determine the plausibility of our conceptions -- so we should concentrate first on justice and disability before looking at the niceties of competing definitions.

We are offered a measured assessment of the merits of social and medical models of disability: the first does less to support justice claims than its proponents suggest, the second does more to support social responses to disadvantage than its opponents suggest. Barclay is right to insist, against advocates of the social model, that not all social contributions to disability amount to injustice; equal accessibility, for example, does not trump all other considerations when determining just social arrangements.

Barclay suggests that any theory of distributive justice should meet two conditions to satisfy common disability demands: it should uphold dignity, and it should offer remedies of the right kind. Resource approaches to distributive justice do less well with the second condition than with the first. Whilst Rawls and Ronald Dworkin are often thought to concentrate overmuch on individually held resources, Barclay reminds us that individual resources matter enormously -- to people with severe impairments, for example, and their careers, who need wheelchairs, hoists and assistive technology. A central charge, however, is held to stand, that the two best-known resource theorists of distributive justice fail adequately to address the structural barriers that contribute to disability disadvantage. Thomas Pogge fares no better, owing to the place in his account of a standard package of resources that is judged insensitive to individual needs.

By comparison with a resource approach, a capabilities approach is deemed to offer a better framework for advancing justice for disabled people. Barclay defends the capabilities approach against familiar charges: the fact, for example, that 'individuals must have resources to secure certain capabilities given their natural endowments cannot in itself support the conclusion that the capabilities theory casts those natural endowments as deficient or inferior' (69). On the other hand, capability theory cannot account for the importance of equal status as expressed in human rights law, and so cannot account for some of our fundamental human rights.

Influential writers come in for well-aimed criticism. Barclay has good reason to challenge Silvers's view that to be treated as needy is, of itself, demeaning, and she offers a nice reply to the letters Elizabeth Anderson composed on behalf of a 'State Equality Board', advocating a view similar to that of Silvers; one's status as a social equal is not undermined just in virtue of being the recipient of public resources that are required to cover the costs of additional needs.

Whilst favouring the capabilities approach, Barclay takes effective aim at one of its best-known advocates, Martha Nussbaum, and her ten capabilities, some thought to be vaguely specified, others requiring multiple specifications in different contexts. Barclay makes a persuasive argument that discrimination is wrong even when it does not prevent us from achieving a sufficient level of capabilities. And she notes that Nussbaum is equivocal about the role of dignity in her theory: all fundamental entitlements are capabilities, and government should treat people with dignity, but she (Nussbaum) does not want to give people the option as to whether they want to be treated with dignity. Barclay is unequivocal: it is more important that we are treated as dignified beings than that we always have opportunities for 'being able to be treated as a dignified being' (108). Generally, capability theory is judged able to handle dignity as worth but not as equal status; so, for example, some of Nussbaum's capabilities imply that people with profound disabilities do not lead fully human or fully dignified lives, and this is found to be incompatible with the equal status that Barclay insists they enjoy.

Writing this review, in December 2018, I cannot go without saying that in the light of recent events, not least in the United States, Barclay's claim that Nussbaum exaggerates the threat that democratic decision-making poses to maintaining fundamental capabilities, such as adequate health care, looks less than secure.

Now for a few reflections on features of the book that, for this reviewer, detracted slightly, though not significantly, from what is nevertheless a formidable achievement.

Throughout, Barclay engages with many of the best-known contributors to philosophical writing on disability, but there are surprising omissions: Adam Cureton on respect, Simo Vehmas on moral status, and Christopher Riddle on the capabilities approach to disability, to name but a few. One cannot engage with everybody, but each of these writers has made a significant contribution to some of the principal debates that Barclay is taken up with. So have the likes of Alice Crary and Hilde Lindemann, working in traditions that have plenty to offer any attempt to understand the moral status of people with disabilities, including people whose disabilities are severe and profound, a group that Barclay frequently discusses.

The book is a little uneven: some important subjects receive a very brief discussion, as with what is said about the metrics of and rules for distributive justice. The last chapter is less complete than the others: it was a brave decision to treat of humiliation in one short paragraph and shame in only a few more; it makes for the bracing read I mentioned earlier, and I, for one, will take that, but others may wonder why there was no more engagement with the voluminous literature on both subjects.

Barclay admits to being 'theoretically promiscuous', and free to 'cherry pick'; not getting 'bogged down in philosophical debates whose outcomes rarely make much difference to our understanding of people's concrete entitlements' (6). She is right about the niceties of philosophical argument rarely impinging on the course of political events (although if we were to fret about the impact of our philosophical work on people's lives many of us would give up now). As to cherry picking -- from what is most valuable in theories of distributive justice, human rights and relational equality -- one worry is that the items we pick might turn out to be in unresolvable tension with one another, and in that case something is probably wrong; and cherry pickers do not have time to pursue arguments as far and deep as they will go. This, at any rate, is supposedly one distinguishing feature of philosophical competence, and one which contributes to whatever authority philosophical contributions are supposed to have in the practical world. Barclay makes a strong case for promiscuity, but there is a division of labour here, one that allows for cherry pickers and those who remorselessly plough their own theoretical furrow.

Barclay makes a periodic appeal to consequentialism, and this may prove to be in tension with the place of dignity in her account of equal status. She rejects the idea that the harm of being treated with indignity comprises only psychological effects; anyone with profound impairments can have their dignity violated, as when we hose down rather than bathe the profoundly impaired residents of a care facility; they may feel no shame, yet 'the dignity violations are extreme' (136). Why?

The residents are not treated as one would treat a social equal, and they are forced into violating standards of dignified bathing . . . routinely observing people in this kind of situation acts to reinforce the view of their inferiority and unworthiness. This makes even worse treatment possible. (136)

If we allow hosing then worse may follow; behaviour like this, if normalised, makes it easier for other things to happen that no one could defend. This is an argument for prohibiting hosing, not yet an argument that hosing violates dignity. True, we do not treat the people we hose as social equals, but it remains to be shown both that this is what they are and that what they are subjected to violates standards of dignified bathing.

A consequentialist strain is evident in the discussion on the right to vote. Barclay defends the extension of the franchise to all people with cognitive disabilities, and she does so by arguing that any benefits of denying some people the right to vote are outweighed by the disadvantages of identifying and excluding some individuals. The argument is well made; but it establishes not the claim that all people have dignity, but the distinct claim that we should treat all people as if they have dignity in order to avoid consequences we regard as indefensible. The enfranchisement of even profoundly disabled people is a 'gain for dignity'; why?

Because a law that publicly declares some people not fit to vote is a threat to their equal status, as is its application. Getting rid of such laws and practices promotes the dignity of people with cognitive disabilities by removing the public declaration of their incompetence. That is surely some kind of win. (126)

I agree, it is; but this is to assume that all people with cognitive disabilities have a dignity to be promoted, and that they have an equal status, and this is just what remains to be shown. (If respect for human dignity requires that all human beings should have the right to vote, does this extend to foetuses and infants? Should they then at least have representatives to vote on their behalf?) Barclay understands that there is work here that she has chosen not to undertake, having made plain, early on, that she 'simply take[s] it for granted that human beings have dignity as worth, or an inherent moral status' (9). Of course, we have to make assumptions; there is only so much one can argue for in one book. The worry is that this large assumption is doing a lot of work in places where it comes under pressure, and it becomes unclear where the work of the assumption of dignity as inherent worth ends, and the explicit work of dignity as equal moral status begins. There is more to dignity as worth than its characterisation as a life which has the same value as others, protected by law from harm and violence (8). Dignity as worth can be approached by considering the conditions in which it is lost, as when someone suffers degradation, humiliation and gross lack of respect, conditions extensively explored in human rights jurisprudence. As Barclay knows well, these conditions are common amongst the lives of people with disabilities, and that is a reason for exploring dignity as worth, in its own right, but also so as to bring out how it is related to dignity as equal status. Someone may lack dignity as equal status because she suffers the humiliation that is incompatible with dignity as inherent worth.

Barclay chooses to eschew identity politics, and there are good reasons for her decision, but it is unclear whether she can avoid discussion of identity and recognition whilst also endorsing relational equality. Treating a person as having equal status 'is to confer dignity upon her' (7); dignity is not simply inherent in individuals, 'but is also at least partly constituted by distinctive forms of interpersonal interaction in which it is expressed' (105). There is a question whether we can explain how dignity is conferred, and made manifest in interaction, without saying something about what it is for one person to treat and recognise someone else as a human being, or as a person, or as a citizen. This requires that we say something about the identity of the human being who, in the interaction, we recognise or fail to recognise under one or other of these descriptions.

In any case, we should be wary of getting too close to a view of dignity as constituted by social interaction, since that could leave our moral status as vulnerable to how others treat us; if others, or most others, happen to treat us disrespectfully it might implausibly follow that our moral status is lower than it would be if we were treated with respect. Barclay would, of course, resist any such implication, but for the resistance to be effective we need to see how 'distinctive forms' of interpersonal interaction both (partly) constitute our dignity and render the dignity of disabled people as immune to at least some of the ways in which others perceive and treat them.

There is much more in these pages than I can begin to do justice to. I have expressed just a few reservations about some aspects of the work, all of which Barclay might consider as directed at targets at some distance from her main agenda, and none of which should take anything away from what is a notable and impressive achievement: one which makes for a significant advance in the philosophy of disability, and, it is to be hoped, in promoting justice for people with disabilities.