Disagreement, Deference, and Religious Commitment

Disagreement Deference And Religious Commitment Book Cover

John Pittard, Disagreement, Deference, and Religious Commitment, Oxford University Press, 2020, 339pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190051815.

Reviewed by Matthew A. Benton, Seattle Pacific University


Philosophers working on the epistemology of disagreement have asked how one ought, if at all, to revise one's beliefs or credences when confronted with facts about others who disagree. For it can seem at first blush that the mere existence of disagreement, at least when it is with those who are roughly one's peers with respect to the evidence and arguments bearing on the issue in question, gives one a reason, perhaps even a very strong reason, to reduce one's confidence (as so-called "conciliationists" have argued). Given widespread (inter-religious) disagreement over the nature of the supernatural, the human condition, morality and spirituality, salvation and redemption, and so on, it looks as though most (if not all) religious worldviews cannot be true. And reflecting on this fact can lead one to wonder why one should adhere to any particular religious outlook. For those who know about such religious diversity yet also lack some reason to suppose that a particular religious worldview is more accurate than the others, it would seem that holding to that worldview must be somehow irrational.

John Pittard's book focuses on religious commitment, but his volume is also an impressive examination of the broader epistemological issues in play. It is the most thorough scholarly treatment yet of how to think about the epistemology of disagreement as it applies to the rationality of religious belief in an increasingly pluralistic world. Readers who are less interested in the epistemology of religion will nevertheless be rewarded by Pittard's carefully developed insights on disagreement and its lessons for mainstream epistemology.

Pittard focuses on a purely higher-order argument from disagreement, what he calls "the Master Argument for Disagreement-Motivated Religious Skepticism":

  1. S's religious outlook is justified only if S has justification for believing that most of her religious beliefs are the result of a reliable process.
  2. In light of S's knowledge of systematic religious disagreement, S should believe that the processes that (otherwise) epistemically qualified people rely on to form religious beliefs are, taken as a whole, very unreliable.
  3. S lacks justification for believing that her process of religious belief formation is significantly more reliable than the collective reliability of the processes that (otherwise) epistemically qualified people use to form religious beliefs.
  4. If (2) and (3), then S lacks justification for believing that most of her religious beliefs are the result of a reliable process.
  5. Thus, S lacks justification for believing that most of her religious beliefs are the result of a reliable process. (From [2], [3], and [4].)
  6. Therefore, S's religious outlook is not justified. (From [1] and [5].) (p. 19)

"Disagreement skeptics" endorsing such an argument will be those who "advocate for religious skepticism as the appropriate response to religious disagreement in particular" (p. 19), even if they do not advocate for a more thoroughgoing conciliationism when it comes to other sorts of disagreements. Pittard ultimately aims to deny the Master Argument's conclusion, but he also endeavors to shed light on what drives the argument's plausibility and which routes of escape are most compelling.

Pittard regards premise 3 as the least plausible, and articulates it as expressing the idea that a subject S would have to regard themself as having, compared with their disagreers, "Equal Estimated Reliability", if they lack justification for believing SUPERIOR:

SUPERIOR: S's process of religious belief formation is significantly more reliable than the collective reliability of the processes that (otherwise) epistemically qualified people use to form religious beliefs. (p. 28)

The challenge, for the disagreement skeptic, is to defend such Equal Estimated Reliability for the religious believer, without allowing in parity considerations by which that religious believer might wield the same argument back against them: for the atheist who wants use the Master Argument above, to argue that theists should reduce their confidence on the basis of considerations from disagreement over theism, will not want their atheism also threatened by a parallel argument to the effect that even an atheistic outlook is unjustified.[1]

Pittard's main interest is in identifying some underlying principles to which, he argues, such disagreement skeptics endorsing premise 3 are committed, starting with an "Internal Reason Constraint" and an "Agent Impartiality Constraint":

INTERNAL REASON CONSTRAINTS has justification for believing SUPERIOR only if S has a good internal reason for believing SUPERIOR. (p. 35)

AGENT IMPARTIALITY CONSTRAINTS has a good internal reason for believing SUPERIOR only if S has a good agent-neutral internal reason for believing SUPERIOR. (p. 38)

Together, these two constraints require that one's reason for believing SUPERIOR must be one which, on the one hand, does not depend on purely external factors making S's (rather than S's disputants) justified, and on the other hand, a reason which does not justify S from her perspective simply because it's S's own reason. While Pittard acknowledges that externalist or agent-centered (first-person perspectival) accounts of justification might be positioned to dispute these constraints (pp. 33-37), Pittard himself finds them plausible, and thus he seeks a different line of response. Pittard notes that the disagreement skeptic who likewise finds them plausible will also need to combine these Internal Reason and Agent Impartiality Constraints with an appeal to a "Reasons Impartiality Constraint" in order to secure premise 3's Equal Estimated Reliability for religious believers:

REASONS IMPARTIALITY CONSTRAINTS has a good agent-neutral internal reason for believing SUPERIOR only if S has a good dispute-independent agent-neutral internal reason for believing SUPERIOR. (p. 46)

Think of a reason being dispute-independent in this sense if one could, in Rawlsian fashion, endorse it from behind the veil of ignorance, without yet knowing which side in the dispute one ends up taking. If REASONS IMPARTIALITY (plus the earlier two constraints) is true, then atheists can use the other two constraints to argue for premise 3 (see pp. 46-47). For together, the three constraints yield: S has justification for believing SUPERIOR only if S has a good dispute-independent agent-neutral internal reason for believing SUPERIOR. That is, such an atheist can demand that the theist provide reasons independent of their dispute over theism for thinking that their religious belief formation processes are significantly more reliable than the collective reliability of such processes (including the many who disagree with their theism); and this looks like a demand the theist cannot fulfill. But Pittard thinks that by needing REASONS IMPARTIALITY, atheists open themselves up to parity rejoinders on which atheism is also unjustified; and he goes on to argue on more general grounds that while the former two constraints (INTERNAL REASON and AGENT IMPARTIALITY) are plausible, the needed REASONS IMPARTIALITY constraint is false.

Pittard argues first that the sort of reasons independence demanded by the REASONS IMPARTIALITY constraint is not well motivated; for the cases (like David Christensen's well-known mental math check-splitting restaurant case[2]) which are thought to support it can be explained in other ways. One can give a Bayesian explanation of why one's credence should be reduced upon learning of such disagreement. Such cases can also be explained solely by appeal to INTERNAL REASON and AGENT IMPARTIALITY once we recognize that one may have forgotten the details of one's mathematical reasoning in a mental math case (pp. 54-64). As such, Pittard maintains that a weak conciliationist position can be better defended by arguing for Instrumentalism, on which "one should, ideally and to the extent possible, treat the deliverances of one's cognitive faculties like readouts of a complex instrument, so that the degree to which one trusts those readouts should be "calibrated" with beliefs about one's cognitive reliability" (p. 96). Yet, as he shows, many of those who argue for naïve versions of Instrumentalism (and who also want to impose impartiality requirements) invoke cases which expect one to respond to higher-order evidence about the reliability of such readouts in ways that ignore one's prior probabilities of the content of such readouts (pp. 101-107).[3] But to appropriately conditionalize on new evidence from an instrument's readout (or from a disagreer), one must take into account its prior probability.

Pittard argues that conciliationists who like so-called "equal weight" views (on which one should grant one's disagreeing peer's opinion a weight equal to one's own) are committed to such Instrumentalism, but that they have often supposed that it supports a more thoroughgoing (strong) conciliationism applicable to both "superficial" and "fundamental" disagreements. But conciliation in response to such fundamental disagreements, which are "driven by differences in epistemic starting points," is not mandated by this commitment to Instrumentalism; indeed, one cannot adopt an Instrumentalist stance toward all of one's doxastic attitudes at once, nor to one's most fundamental attitude to the proposition in question (one's "ur-prior," in Bayesian discussions) (pp. 105-109). Thus the italicized "to the extent possible" in the above definition of Instrumentalism opens up an important distinction, which enables Pittard to embrace a form of conciliationism (for superficial disagreements) while insisting that religious disagreements need not rob religious believers of their justification: such disagreements can be, and perhaps typically are, fundamental rather than superficial.

Yet even where religious disagreements are superficial rather than fundamental, it may be possible for the religious believer to remain confident. Pittard's positive proposal is to develop a "rationalist" approach combined with weak conciliationism, on which one may justifiably remain confident of one's own view even when disagreers seem equally qualified (judged from a dispute-neutral standpoint), if one "has a priori rational insight into the truth or plausibility of some proposition or into the cogency of some line of reasoning in support of" it (pp. 160ff.). Such rational insight may serve as the "symmetry breaker" in such otherwise even-sided disagreements, if it helps "supply an all-things-considered reason for thinking that one's own outlook is rationally stronger than the outlooks of one's disputants" (p. 168). Pittard goes on to develop an "affective rationalism" in the religious case which gives an essential role to emotional experiences that facilitate certain sorts of religious insights (Chapter 5). And these religiously relevant "evaluative insights" (moral, axiological, and aesthetic judgments) are often grounded in certain affective responses to religious experiences (p. 193). Such affective judgments might confer genuine insight about the plausibility of theism, for example, but then such insight is not primarily an argumentative accomplishment. In this way, his rationalism is not available only to the analytically sophisticated religious believer, and it opposes the "antirationalism of certain reformed epistemologists and the austere, highly intellectualist rationalism characteristic of contemporary natural theology" (p. 182). (For those unconvinced, in his final two chapters Pittard articulates the consequences for religious commitment for one who opts instead for a strong conciliationism of the sort he has opposed.)

While Pittard's positive proposal (in Chapters 4 and 5) distinguishes itself as a significant advancement in the epistemology of religious disagreement, his rationalist line invites two important questions. First, isn't relying on one side's rationalist insight to break the disagreement symmetry in itself a way of appealing to a feature of the disagreement which is neither dispute-neutral nor agent-neutral? Pittard represents his account as being one which successfully opposes the REASONS IMPARTIALITY constraint while nevertheless accepting the AGENT IMPARTIALITY constraint; yet being partial to one's own view due to having a rational insight into its truth feels very much like someone being "partial toward her own reasoning, doxastic inclinations, or experiential evidence for reasons that are irreducibly first personal" (p. 37), which is the hallmark of agent partiality.

Second, if both parties to a disagreement have what they regard as rational insights into the greater merit of their view, isn't Pittard's rationalist weak conciliationism designed to affirm them each as justified in maintaining their confidence, despite the symmetrical disagreement? When illustrating the support that can be played by rationalist insight, Pittard uses a case of two math students with equally reliable track records, Sierra and Arjun, who come up with different answers to the Monty Hall problem: Arjun argues (coherently, but incorrectly) that there is no advantage to switching doors, whereas Sierra argues (correctly) that two-thirds of the time, switching doors will win the contestant the car. Taking only impartial considerations into account would mean that each of Sierra and Arjun should conciliate by converging on a similar credence. Pittard argues, however, that even though neither can pinpoint the problem with the other's reasoning, Sierra's (correct) rational insight into the cogency of her reasoning can make her justified in remaining more confident that her answer is correct (pp. 168-172). But what if Arjun has a comparable rational insight into his own reasoning? Pittard does not consider this parallel possibility, which raises a dilemma. Pittard either must allow that Arjun can have such rational insight, in which case Arjun and Sierra are both justified, given that Sierra is, in remaining confident of their own answer; but if so, he loses the conciliationist flavor of his account. Or, Pittard can insist that Arjun's insight is not a genuine insight[4] into the cogency of his reasoning, even though it seems from Arjun's perspective as if it is. Yet taking this latter line would invoke a rationalism which ultimately severs justification from the first-person perspective, and this is an approach to which Pittard seems unsympathetic.

The application to religious disputes seems clear: if adherents of different religions disagree but also claim to have coherent insights borne of affective judgments, it appears they can justifiably remain stalemated. Perhaps this is the most plausible result, but it is one which departs from the spirit of conciliationism.


[1] See Philip Kitcher, Life after Faith: The Case for Secular Humanism (Oxford Univ Press, 2014), and Richard Feldman, "Reasonable Religious Disagreements," in Philosophers without Gods: Meditations on Atheism and the Secular Life, ed. Louise M. Antony, 194-214 (Oxford Univ Press, 2007), each of whom are eager to avoid such parity responses, though they struggle to confront them adequately. Compare also John Hick, An Interpretation of Religion: Human Responses to the Transcendent, 2nd edn. (Yale Univ Press, 2004), who appeals to religious disagreement and the apparent symmetry of religious belief forming processes to argue not for religious skepticism but for an alethic religious pluralism on which the major world religions are all products of contact with the transcendent, yet none any more true or accurate than another.

[2] E.g., see David Christensen's defense of an independence principle in "Disagreement, Question-Begging and Epistemic Self-Criticism," Philosophers' Imprint 11, no. 6 (2011).

[3] Cf. similar points recently made by Yoaav Isaacs, "The Fallacy of Calibrationism," Philosophy & Phenomenological Research (2019, early view): 1-14.

[4] Pittard claims, on the one hand, that "insight" is a success term, such that one whose thinking "is muddled and utterly confused lacks genuine insight, even if she is convinced" it is "cogent and insightful"; but on the other hand, "a false belief that p could still be supported by genuine insight," as when one has "insight into the truth of one or more propositions" which "rationally support" some (nevertheless false) p (p. 161).