Disclosing the World: On the Phenomenology of Language

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Andrew Inkpin, Disclosing the World: On the Phenomenology of Language, MIT Press, 2016, 381pp., $43.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262033916.

Reviewed by David G. Stern, University of Iowa


This is an ambitious book. Beginning with Heidegger's suggestive but fragmentary discussion of language in Being and Time (Part I), Andrew Inkpin draws on insights from the early Merleau-Ponty (Part II) and the later Wittgenstein (Part III) to fill in the gaps in the "Heideggerian framework" that he takes as his starting point. While each of these first three parts takes the form of a close reading and interpretation of the relevant texts, Inkpin's overarching aim is not primarily exegetical fidelity, but rather working out a systematic solution to the philosophical problems they raise. The two main problems are that of providing a general statement of the overall nature of phenomenology, and that of specifying the form that a phenomenological philosophy of language should take. Finally, in "Some Philosophical Implications" (Part IV), Inkpin argues that the results arrived at in his previous exploration of the phenomenology of language have consequences for a number of related debates. These include the dissolution of the debate between realists and anti-realists (chapter 8); the overall relationship between his phenomenological approach to language on the one hand, and post-Fregean philosophy of language on the other; the debate between Dreyfus and McDowell over whether our prereflective engagement in embodied action should be seen as conceptually structured (chapter 9); and the implications of Inkpin's phenomenological conception of language for 4E (embodied, embedded, enactive, and extended) cognitive science (chapter 10).

As this very brief summary already suggests, this is a lengthy, and often intricate, discussion of a remarkably wide range of issues and authorse usually regarded as belonging to the domains of very different philosophical communities. However, the book's phenomenological approach to language is united by a guiding thread, one that is effectively set out at the very beginning. Inkpin starts by asking us to reflect on the fact that our ordinary experience of language and of our everyday action is usually effortless, precisely because such experiences are so familiar, so much a part of our daily routine. As a result of this taken-for-granted familiarity, our "default experience of language" does not provide us with the resources we need to attain "an articulate grasp of the various ways language mediates understanding of the world and what it is about language that enables it to do this" (1). Next, Inkpin makes the Heideggerian point that it is precisely when our routine ways of acting and speaking break down, when they no longer work smoothly and unobtrusively, that we have an opportunity to attend to and so better understand the skills we previously took for granted. He offers two striking examples of circumstances in which one can be made aware of one's own linguistic competence, and its limitations. First, he cites his experiences as a second-language learner and teacher in the former East Germany shortly after the fall of the Berlin Wall. Second, he mentions the difficulties one faces in interpreting Heidegger's philosophical prose, and his idiosyncratic use of familiar words in unexpected ways. While these examples are drawn from his own personal experience, they are kinds of experiences that are available to anyone in similar circumstances, and involve no resources over and above those accessible to any competent speaker.

These aspects of our use of language provide a starting point for Inkpin's phenomenological approach to language, and its focus on the role that our use of language plays in disclosing the world. Inkpin's use of the Heideggerian term "disclosure" expresses his commitment to the idea that language is not only a means of communication, but is also a "process of articulation in the public space that plays a constitutive role in human actions and thought" (5). The method that he adopts is phenomenological, broadly speaking, but it amounts to no more than a "minimalist conception of phenomenological method, defined by the basic commitment . . . to describe how things appear or manifest themselves" (6). So while the book draws extensively on authors in the phenomenological tradition, and starts from a broadly Heideggerian conception of language as disclosing the world, its conception of phenomenology does not include the baroque and intricate details characteristic of Heidegger's specific ways of working out that programmatic commitment. This willingness to learn from the mighty dead without falling under their spell gives the book much of its energy and momentum. Inkpin has no time for Heidegger's "recovery of 'original' meanings" (3) or Merleau-Ponty's "systematic bias in favor of creative expression" (156), and is almost equally brusque in his handling of Wittgenstein's "infamous suggestion that philosophy is not about putting forward "theses"" (164-7).

Inkpin argues that any interpretation of Heidegger's account of the role of language in disclosure has to resolve an apparent tension between two desiderata that Heidegger tried to respect. On the one hand, Heidegger insists that language is "continuous with other meaningful activities" (35), and that the use of language can be understood as a particularly sophisticated form of tool-using activity, progressively building from lower to higher levels of determinacy. This pragmatic approach is developed in detail in §§28-33 of Being and Time, and naturally lends itself to a view of language on which it only plays a peripheral role in disclosure, as a supplement to our pre-linguistic skills. On the other hand, in §34 of Being and Time Heidegger insists that linguistic articulation has a quite specific form, namely being about something, and saying something of it, and that this is sharply distinct from other forms of intelligent behavior. This constitutive approach, which appears to draws a firm line between language and other meaningful activities, lends itself to a view of language on which all understanding shares a specifically linguistic structure.

A key question here is how to understand Heidegger's term Rede, usually translated as "discourse" or "talk", but which Inkpin translates as 'Articulacy'. He does so partly to avoid the usual connotations of the familiar English words, but also to highlight Heidegger's definition of Rede as "the articulation of intelligibility" (33). On the pragmatic model just described, any skillful behaviour involves Articulacy, yet is not necessarily linguistic. On the constitutive model, however, Articulacy is either equivalent to language, or very closely bound up with it. This issue is the focus of deep disagreement amongst interpreters of Heidegger's account of language in Being and Time. As Inkpin shows, this is not only because one can find strong support for each model in the text, but also because the disagreement turns on an underlying philosophical problem: how are our linguistic abilities related to other forms of intelligent behavior? On the constitutive approach, language is paradigmatic of all intelligent behavior; on the pragmatic approach, it is just one manifestation of a more basic capacity.

Inkpin's solution to this problem takes the form of a compromise between these two apparently incompatible models. He proposes that Heidegger is best understood as distinguishing between two kinds of Articulacy: the first is the focus of the pragmatic approach, while the second is the concern of the constitutive approach. Skillful coping and purposive awareness are potentially linked to linguistic expression, but do not entail predicative awareness on the actor's part. Language is continuous with other meaningful phenomena, but also has a specific and distinctive constitutive role. On this complex view, language is also embedded in a broader "purposive, holistic, inarticulate background awareness" (50) and has prepredicative "uses that cannot be functionally assimilated to predicative understanding" (51).

Working out the details of this view is the overarching project that guides the argument of the remainder of the book. One of Inkpin's principal tasks is to clarify the murky notions of prepredicative awareness and prepredicative language use. The final chapter on Heidegger is devoted to an exploration of the proposal that Articulacy not only has an "articulatory function . . . its role in structuring a determinate understanding of the world" (67) but also has a "demonstrative function" (67): its role in directly apprehending the world, and pointing out features of the world (67). Inkpin argues that Heidegger is drawn to the idea that the "proper function of Articulacy is . . . to see the world directly in the way it is presented (by language) as being" (83). This is a difficult notion to grasp. Inkpin initially asserts that it simply amounts to the truism that language "often makes us aware of how the world (itself) is" (84), but he also holds that it leads to the thesis that "linguistic expressions have a presentational sense, a kind of sense that underlies their capacity to present features of the world in an articulate manner and that is due specifically to the form of linguistic expressions" (84). Furthermore, both pragmatic and presentational sense "should be understood in terms of factors that are subpropositional, subinferential, and irreducible to the predicative functioning of propositions" (91; see also 58-65).

In Part II, Inkpin draws on Merleau-Ponty's work on embodiment and his discussions of "indirect sense" to provide an account of the presentational aspect of language, while in Part III he draws on Wittgenstein's discussion of rules and practice to develop his interpretation of the pragmatic aspect of language. As the very idea of presentational sense struck me at first sight as utterly implausible, and nothing in Part II persuaded me to change my mind, I will focus on Part III in the remainder of this review.

Inkpin's discussion of the development of Wittgenstein's philosophy of language is based on two guiding theses: one methodological, and one substantive. The methodological thesis is his reply to an objection to his reading of Wittgenstein that Inkpin calls the "no-thesis thesis." This is the objection that since Wittgenstein's philosophy was therapeutic, and aimed at liberation from philosophical views, "no position, whatever its content, could be said to represent Wittgenstein's own views" (164). Inkpin considers the Cavellian proposal that we read Wittgenstein as entertaining or discussing philosophical views without asserting their truth as the most promising way of developing this Pyrrhonian objection, and -- full disclosure -- discusses my own work (Stern 1996, 2004) as his chosen example of this approach (165). Responding to my observation that the positions discussed in the Philosophical Investigations are expressed by several opposing voices, and so cannot be simply construed as a statement of the author's convictions, Inkpin's initial reply is to observe that one voice, the "voice of correctness," does present "theoretical views that appear to be Wittgenstein's own" (166). He also concedes that the views he attributes to the author of the Investigations are best understood as a preference for a specific conception of language, one that Wittgenstein advances by providing analogies and comparisons with the aim of eliminating misunderstandings, rather than as a matter of directly advancing positive theses. It is certainly true that Wittgenstein does engage in extensive discussion of various views about meaning, and Inkpin is entitled to draw on them in developing his account of the relationship between language and practice.

However, once this methodological prelude is over, Inkpin's own use of Wittgenstein is much less nuanced. In effect, he approaches Wittgenstein as though he were a systematic philosopher who happened to employ an unconventional writing style. Or, to be more accurate, he follows the well-trodden path of telling a story about the relationship between views of the Early and Late Wittgenstein, a story on which the emergence of the later philosophy turns on one's favored philosophical insight. The substantive thesis that Inkpin extracts from his reading of Wittgenstein's philosophical development, turns on the idea that the early and middle Wittgenstein's "commitment to the idea that Rules Constitute Meaning (RCM)" became subordinate, in the hands of the later Wittgenstein "to the idea that Practice Constitutes Meaning (PCM)" (163). On this reading, while the middle Wittgenstein still subscribed to an overly intellectual conception of language as a calculus, a formal system of rules, the later Wittgenstein saw that "RCM gets things the wrong way round . . . rules do not in themselves make language use meaningful, but are simply symptomatic of humans acting (repetitively) in meaningful ways" (163). In particular, Inkpin maintains that the later Wittgenstein gave up the calculus model, his earlier underlying conception of language, because it requires that concepts are fully determinate, and the regress-of-rules argument in Investigations §§84-88 shows that there can be no fully determinate, regress-blocking rules (178-82).

This rather schematic construal leads Inkpin to overlook much of what is most interesting about Wittgenstein's later work on meaning. His discussion of the middle Wittgenstein is almost entirely based on a few selected passages from the Philosophical Grammar, which he dates to 1933. Actually, the instructions and extensive revisions which were used by Wittgenstein's editors to assemble that text date from 1934 or later, while most of the content was composed between 1930 and 1932. What matters most for present purposes is that the Philosophical Grammar is not a polished text, but rather a posthumous reconstruction of two sets of plans for the revision of The Big Typescript, and so many different strands of work in progress can be found there in various stages of development. While the calculus analogy is certainly discussed there, the book begins by criticizing the calculus conception, and the consequence that meaning is determinate and precisely bounded. Indeed, there is extensive discussion in both the Philosophical Grammar and The Big Typescript of the idea that understanding is amorphous, and inexact: the idea that meaning is not always rule-governed is already a central concern. Furthermore, that idea is motivated not by a master argument from the impossibility of fully specifying meaning in rules, but by a phenomenologically detailed description of the variety of phenomena involved in understanding, meaning, and thinking, and by considering the analogy between understanding a sentence and understanding a musical melody. Given the key role that Inkpin assigns to the regress-of-rules argument against the calculus model as a turning point in the emergence of the later philosophy, it is odd that he does not mention the fact the regress-of-rules argument is already very clearly set out in §9 of the Philosophical Grammar. Indeed, as Fogelin (ch. 1) observes in his recent discussion of the emergence of Wittgenstein's later conception of rule-following, that version of the argument in the Philosophical Grammar already sets out a version of PCM.[1]

In other words, the story that Inkpin tells about the central role of the rule-following argument in the emergence of Wittgenstein's later criticism of the calculus model of meaning does not hold up once one looks more carefully at his own chosen text from the middle period. Indeed, given more space and time, I would argue that if one examines Wittgenstein's use of rule-following regress arguments in his later work, they are used to undermine theses about the primacy of practice, not prove them. But what is perhaps oddest about Inkpin's use of the later Wittgenstein as a way of filling in his "Heideggerian framework" is that this is much like sending coals to Newcastle, for there is already a well-established tradition of reading Being and Time as turning on regress arguments about rule-following and background practices.


Fogelin, Robert, 2009, Taking Wittgenstein at his Word. Princeton University Press.

Pichler, Alois, forthcoming., "Two Voices in the Middle Wittgenstein."

Stern, David G., 1996, 'The Availability of Wittgenstein's Philosophy', in Hans Sluga and David G. Stern (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Wittgenstein, Cambridge University Press, 442-476.

Stern, David G., 2004, Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press.

Stern, David G., 2014, "The 'Middle Wittgenstein' Revisited", In Proceedings of the 36th International Ludwig Wittgenstein-Symposium, de Gruyter.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1953, Philosophical Investigations, edited by G. E. M. Anscombe and R. Rhees, Blackwell, Fourth, revised edition, edited by P. M. S. Hacker and Joachim Schulte, 2009.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1974, Philosophical Grammar, First published in 1969 as Philosophische Grammatik, German text only, edited by R. Rhees, Blackwell, English translation by A. Kenny, 1974, Blackwell.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 2005, The Big Typescript, edited by C. Grant Luckhardt and M. A. E. Aue, translation on facing pages, Blackwell.

[1] For further discussion of Fogelin's interpretation of this passage, and the development of the rule-following argument, see Stern 2014. The first part of this paragraph draws on work by Pichler (forthcoming).