Discovering Levinas

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Michael L. Morgan, Discovering Levinas, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 504pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521872591.

Reviewed by Claire Katz, Texas A&M University


I can no longer count the number of times that I have heard people say that Emmanuel Levinas is one of the most difficult philosophers they have ever encountered -- and this comment is frequently uttered by those trained primarily in "Continental" philosophy.  One can only imagine then how Levinas's project might appear to those unequipped with the vocabulary and conceptual frameworks of Husserl and Heidegger, Rosenzweig or Bergson, on whom so much of Levinas's work relies.  Michael Morgan's book, Discovering Levinas, is a masterful reading of Levinas.  It not only provides a clear account of Levinas's ethical project for those trained in European philosophy, but it also makes Levinas's account of the ethical accessible to those who are not.  In so doing, Morgan acknowledges the ways that analytic philosophy and continental philosophy remain different in their methodologies and their concerns.  And yet in spite of these differences, Morgan demonstrates what is lost when we maintain the boundaries that divide professional philosophy.

Morgan's story for coming to this project is worth repeating here for it not only provides his motivation and his credentials, but also reveals a philosopher at his best.  In an all too familiar story where Levinas could be interchanged with any number of thinkers, Morgan tells us in his Preface that he attempted to read Levinas many times but never made it past the first few pages and quickly put Levinas aside, moving on to other projects.  He then agreed to team teach a course with Paul Franks on Levinas and Rosenzweig, the latter, though just as impenetrable as Levinas, was a thinker much more familiar to Morgan.  (Morgan and Franks had translated and edited a collection of Rosenzweig's writings.)  Before the class began, Franks moved from Indiana University to Notre Dame and Morgan was left to teach the class solo.  Rather than drop Levinas and limit the course to Rosenzweig, Morgan rose to the challenge.  As he worked through the material with his students and watched them become entranced by Levinas's ideas, Morgan continued to find new ways to decipher and explain those ideas.

Morgan confesses in the Preface that he is the first reader for this book; the questions that he raises and pursues are his own.  Yet he has identified the questions that generally are the ones that most readers of Levinas, even those who think they understand him (myself included), ask.  In his attempt to answer these questions, his book engages figures as diverse as Donald Davidson and Martin Buber, Franz Rosenzweig and John Rawls, Stanley Cavell and Jacques Derrida.  By not adhering to either disciplinary or ideological boundaries, Morgan demonstrates that there is something of value to be gained from reading across these lines. Morgan is a philosopher of the highest order and he clearly demonstrates his ability in this project. 

Morgan's book covers quite a bit of territory: ethics, politics, phenomenology, Judaism, Zionism, the Holocaust, and more.  His choice to examine individual essays and then turn to Levinas's long and dense monographs only when needed is effective for examining some key concepts in Levinas's thought.  Many of Levinas's essays are more manageable and articulate his ideas more clearly than his books.  It is also helpful for those who might decide to read some of Levinas's writings, since they now have a guide to many of his most significant writings.  However, there is a cost to this strategy.  Some key concepts and tropes, and the movement of the texts as a whole, are lost by not offering a sustained reading of them. My point is less a criticism of Morgan's book than it is to make readers aware of what might be missing.  No book can do everything and I believe that Morgan made the right choice both for himself and for his audience.

Morgan’s initial move is to try to understand what concerns Levinas.  What motivates him to write about ethics and what is the ethics that he is trying to describe?  Morgan begins with an exposition of Vasily Grossman's Life and Fate.  Although he suspects that Levinas read Grossman's book in the 1980s (quite late in Levinas's career) the images that Grossman portrays and that Levinas cites are helpful for a first pass at understanding Levinas's concerns.  Grossman's novel is about the crisis of European culture, a theme that Levinas refers to frequently, particularly in his Jewish writings.  But in addition to that overall theme resonating with his own concerns, there are specific images that Levinas finds compelling.  For example, there is an instance of unexplainable and spontaneous kindness in a situation where one would not only expect but would understand if hatred carried the day.  Morgan quotes from Is it Righteous to Be:

[T]oward the book's end, when Stalingrad has already been rescued, the German prisoners, including an officer, are cleaning out a basement and removing the decomposing bodies.  The officer suffers particularly from this misery.  In the crowd, a woman who hates Germans is delighted to see this man more miserable than the others.  Then she gives him the last piece of bread she has.  This is extraordinary.  Even in hatred there exists a mercy stronger than hatred. (6)

Certainly we do not know what Grossman intended, nor do we know the real motivation of the woman.  But as Morgan rightly points out, this woman's act, exhibits exactly what Levinas means by the ethical.  It is at once extraordinary and also banal.  She simply gives a piece of bread, her last piece of bread, to a person whom she despises.  Morgan's substantive treatment of Grossman's book is helpful.  It locates an otherwise abstract concept within the concrete situations of a novel, making the concept more accessible.  This first chapter then, which opens with the discussion of Grossman's book, places Levinas's project within the context of Levinas's own relationship to suffering -- his own, that of the Jewish people and of those who have suffered similarly.

In chapter 2 Morgan places Levinas's project within the context of phenomenology and demonstrates the ways in which Levinas is right in his self-description, that his project is phenomenological, disclosing or revealing what is otherwise occluded.  Yet Morgan is also right to point out the problems with this account.  What does it mean to describe that which is pre-experiential?  Is this not antithetical to phenomenology?  Since phenomenology describes that which appears, how does one describe the experience of that which has not appeared?  What then does this mean for calling Levinas a transcendental philosopher?  And here also Morgan is right to register the objection: "They [the face of the other person and the responsibility of the self] are hidden or forgotten 'horizons of meaning' and somehow beyond ontology, being, presence, appearance, and such.  They are not new items or features, for they are neither new nor entities nor features at all" (56).  Morgan's analysis is balanced and he is able to articulate how Levinas's project is indebted to phenomenology while also being outside phenomenology, and thus not transcendental in a straightforward way.  It can be noted that Merleau-Ponty's work (another influence on Levinas), especially his work on the "pre-reflective", is subject to similar criticism.  That is, Levinas would not be the first to use the phenomenological method to describe an experience that seems antithetical to the parameters of phenomenology itself.

Chapters 3 and 4 examine the ethical content of Levinas's project.  In chapter 3, Morgan explores the "face" and what this means, and in chapter 4 Morgan looks at the key terms of totality and infinity.  Here he explores Levinas's relationship to Rosenzweig, whom Levinas credits with the idea of totality.  Chapter 5 looks at language and meaning.  Chapter 6 engages Levinas and his concept of the subject with contemporary mainstream thinkers such as Davidson, McDowell and Taylor.  Chapters 7, 8, and 11 look at Levinas and religion, and in particular Levinas and Judaism.  Chapter 11 in particular is quite extraordinary in the ground that it covers.  Here Morgan is able to identify precisely how Levinas's "version" of Judaism has had an impact on his philosophical project.  The central point is the role of education in Judaism, that Judaism commands its followers to teach its sources. Levinas sees as the central tenet of this Judaism the imperative to respond to the Other.  In a longer, and more controversial, discussion of Levinas and Zionism Morgan takes up the now infamous statement Levinas made during a radio interview when he was asked about the attacks on Sabra and Chatila.  Wouldn't the Palestinian be the Other?  Levinas replied:  that is not how I think of the Other.  Morgan offers a sensitive, though not apologetic, interpretation of the exchange claiming that the interviewer had misconstrued the idea of the Other as having to be the enemy (20-21; 410-412).  Levinas's reply is consistent when he says the Other can be my kin, my neighbor; one has to make choices when one's neighbor is being harmed by other Others.  Additionally, the Other for Levinas is the person whose face is neither Palestinian nor Israeli.  Once these terms are introduced, we are at the level of ontology, politics, and choice.

Chapters 9 and 10, and his concluding remarks and appendix look at Levinas in relationship to contemporary ethical thought, particularly the work of Korsgaard, O'Neill, Rorty, and Cavell.  For those in mainstream philosophy these chapters might seem simultaneously to be the most helpful and the most confusing.  These discussions reveal the ways that Levinas seems to resemble many of these figures while turning out to be very different.  One place where we see the categories of analytic ethics simply not applying to Levinas, though on the surface and to many readers of Levinas they seem to apply quite well, is in discussions of supererogatory acts, heroic acts, altruism, and martyrdom -- the last meant not in a religious sense but as sacrificing oneself.  This discussion follows after Morgan has admirably demonstrated why Levinas does not fit neatly into the category of moral perfectionist, certainly not in the sense in which Emerson is considered one.  Yet it is also here that the discussion of the categories makes me uneasy.

Morgan rightly says that Levinas is not a moral perfectionist -- and then later he demonstrates why terms like supererogatory also do not fit him (268-283).  My worry is that the initial discussion makes it look like Levinas could have been a moral perfectionist, but in the end he turns out not to be one.  Levinas is not a moral perfectionist because he holds that the ethical response is not about the self.  For him the ethical is not about improving the self or living up to a standard that has been set for me or humankind.  Ethics, for Levinas, is about the self's response to the other.  I have a similar concern with the discussion about supererogation and moral saints (289-299).  To apply these terms to Levinas implies that for Levinas there is a moral law or moral rule that we have achieved or exceeded.  As I read Levinas, these terms simply do not apply.  Morgan indicates this point also, and he rightly points out that where Levinas would disagree with Susan Wolf and her account of moral saints is in thinking that "moral responsibility pervades our lives" -- it is not an extra task that we add to our list of things to do (296; 298).  Morgan's point comes late in the discussion and I wonder if it might have saved his readers some confusion had he stated this point more clearly up front.

Without doubt these questions, which generally apply to mainstream moral theory, are often raised in response to Levinas's project and what appears to be an impossible ethics:  Who could possibly live life this way?  The confusion, then, surrounding the life that Levinas seems to be asking us to lead and the life he seems to be describing is in part due to Levinas's own lack of clarity.  Morgan seems to pick up on this point but at other times he also conflates the two -- the interruption of the face is also the command to feed the poor.  And the conflation is understandable.  Levinas does this himself.  As a result, there is much debate over the question of normativity in Levinas's ethics -- how much is he asking of us and to what extent is he merely describing us?  And if he is simply doing the latter, then so what?  What does it mean to say that I have been interrupted by the face of the other but nonetheless went about my day as if nothing happened?  Isn't there something normative in Levinas's ethical project?  If not, shouldn't there be?  The question is a frustrating one, in part because Levinas himself is not clear about the answer to it. I, too, find myself moving back and forth between these two views.  The first is that Levinas is simply describing the ethical dimension of our lives, a dimension that, although it has been covered over, forms the very basis of who we are as subjects in the world.  The second is a sense that there is something normative in Levinas's ethics, that he wants us to do something.  Although Morgan has made excellent use of the right people for secondary scholarship, he might have found help in some others who have addressed this question specifically, e.g., Diane Perpich on Levinas and political philosophy and Leslie MacAvoy on Levinas and Kant.

At the beginning of Totality and Infinity, Levinas asks if we have not been duped by morality.  There are different ways to read this statement, but one way is to wonder if Levinas is responding to nihilism, trying to establish that ethics is not only possible but pervades our very existence.  If we read him this way then the question of the normative and what I ought to do becomes secondary to demonstrating that ethics is a fundamental part of who we are.  There are several places we can turn to in his work to get a glimpse at what he is trying to show us.  In his essay "Dying for … " Levinas challenges the Heideggerian conception of being-towards-death as simply an ontological structure, one that cannot have ethical significance.  Love is stronger than death, transcends death.  And in his interview with Bracha Lichtenberg-Ettinger he comments on women dying in childbirth.  His claim is descriptive, not normative.  He is noting this as an act that happens and when it does it indicates that a woman died in order to give life to another.  To be clear, he is not recommending that women martyr themselves nor is he prescribing it.  Rather, he is noticing that there are moments when the conatus essendi, the Self's drive to persevere and live at all costs, is interrupted and overridden by a sacrifice of the self for another.  It is not that the individual believes that she is removing the other's mortality, as in Heidegger's objection.  Rather, it is about putting the other first -- thus the ontological fact of the death of the other is transformed into an ethical act.

For Levinas, then, there is no category of ethical acceptability or supererogatory, akrasia or strong-willed.  Rather there is the social dimension that Morgan describes so nicely, the fundamental sociality that founds our everyday actions and is revealed in these moments.  Levinas cannot tell us what it is we should do, how we should act, or how much can get done.  To do so would be first to fall into the lines of moral theory with a guidebook for our actions, the very ethical project Levinas's project counters.  Moreover, it would create a limit to ethics -- here is what we are supposed to do and these actions get us a reward.  It would violate the radicality of his view of the ethical, which is infinite responsibility, a debt that cannot be fulfilled.  We are never done, though ethics is always put into check by politics, by the choices we make resulting from the competing obligations on our lives.

In spite of Morgan's exceptional reading, there are nonetheless a few controversial points I wish to note.  Since Morgan's book could very well serve as a introduction to those who are unfamiliar with Levinas’s project, my comments are intended to supplement Morgan's.  The first is a minor point that is simply to direct readers to the growing scholarship that raises questions about Levinas's relationship to Rosenzweig.  Levinas's statement regarding Rosenzweig in his Preface to Totality and Infinity is, as Morgan rightly recounts, now infamous:  "We were impressed by the opposition to the idea of totality in Franz Rosenzweig's Stern der Erlösung, a work too often present in this book to be cited" (Totality and Infinity, 28).  As we can see, Levinas is referring specifically to Rosenzweig's idea of totality.  Levinas never claims to find the ethical relation directly in Rosenzweig's work, though clearly he makes these connections by mapping his ideas about the ethical onto what he sees as comparable, or at least inspirational, ideas in Rosenzweig.  There is however a growing philosophical camp that argues Levinas's debt to Rosenzweig is unfounded and much work is being done to disjoin Levinas from Roseznweig.  I admit that I am more compelled by Morgan's reading, since he seems to see that it is not that Levinas actually finds the ethical relation in Rosenzweig but rather he finds the inspiration for that ethical relation in ideas that Rosenzweig explores.  Nonetheless readers should be aware that this mapping is not an unproblematic one and they might turn to Samuel Moyn's recent book, for example, in order to draw their own conclusions.

My second point relates to Morgan's comment about the feminine -- or rather eros -- in Totality and Infinity, which is not quite accurate.  Morgan writes,

In Time and the Other and Totality and Infinity, Levinas uses a dialectical narrative to display the basic features of subjectivity, as I have just reviewed them, and he then carries out a quasi-phenomenological description of eros in order to clarify the face-to-face and the subject's passivity before the other person (155). 

In Time and the Other Levinas had not yet developed the face-to-face nor had he named the ethical relation as such.  I agree with Morgan that Time and the Other provides a sketch or a blueprint that Levinas later develops in Totality and Infinity.  Whatever the status of eros in Time and the Other, it seems clear in Totality and Infinity that eros is in fact separated from the ethical.  This does not mean that the ethical is nowhere to be found and that one can do whatever one wants with or to one's beloved.  Rather, it means that the features that define the erotic relation are different from those that define the face-to-face, or the ethical relation.  And the key here is the way that erotic love has the potential to be a return to the Same, to be egoist, possessive, and so forth.  The Self is in fact not passive before the Beloved, but rather wants to possess her.  And it is the birth of the child that interrupts this return and calls the couple out of themselves towards an Other.  The point is not a minor one, nor is the role of the feminine in Levinas's work, which mutates over the forty years in which he writes, and in fact becomes the paradigm for the ethical relation in Otherwise than Being.  So I would simply direct readers to the many books and essays that have been written on the feminine in Levinas's project.

My last point is more a question for Morgan.  He is a first-rate scholar who clearly took care and energy to read Levinas's texts and understand his project, and his book does not cut corners.  I would simply ask why he did not devote any substantial discussion to Levinas's trope of the feminine, which plays a major role in at least two of his books.  I realize that no book can do everything, and I think my concern reflects my earlier point that when one adopts a particular strategy there is a cost.  I cannot help but wonder if the lack of attention to the feminine is the result of not doing a sustained reading of Levinas's central books where the trope of the feminine is most prevalent.  My comment here is less a criticism than it is an expression of a lost opportunity.  If there is one place where the bridge between analytic and continental philosophy has been more than adequately erected it is in feminist theory.  Different engagements with Levinas's conception of the feminine from these different methodologies might have added to his project and certainly expanded his audience.

I did my graduate work in a department that was committed to having their students bridge the philosophical traditions.  Nearly ten years ago, at my dissertation defense, the member of my committee who was the designated analytic reader asked me how Levinas's work was similar to or different from ethics of care or other similar contemporary critiques of analytic ethics.  Although my examiner's question indicated that he was still unclear about what Levinas was up to, his question was nonetheless appropriate and I could easily see how it occurred to him.  I did my best to answer the question by indicating that ethics of care, like the moral theories to which it responds, is simply another way to determine how one acts; or put another way, it offers a different set of reasons or parameters for how moral decision making happens -- relationally as opposed to duty or principles.  But the point is that both ethics of care and the moral theories to which it responds already assume a Levinasian framework of responsibility.  That is, Levinas's ethics applies to both and he would simply see ethics of care as another moral theory -- the political.  My examiner seemed satisfied with my response, but I'm sure my answer could have been much clearer and more substantial had Michael Morgan's book been available to me then.  Morgan's book is a significant contribution to the field of Levinas scholarship.  It is not only a book to be recommended to students -- graduate students and undergraduate alike -- but it is also a book that many of us will recommend to our colleagues with the hope that they might on the one hand better understand the projects in which we engage, while on the other find philosophical ideas, tools, and language for their own projects that they might not otherwise have known existed.