Disorientation and Moral Life

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Ami Harbin, Disorientation and Moral Life, Oxford University Press, 2016, 256pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190277406.

Reviewed by Elise Springer, Wesleyan University


How is moral life is affected by major practical disorientations -- by profound experiences of feeling at a loss for how to go on with one's life? Many moral theorists will treat major disorientations the way Aristotle treats shame: in the context of a moral life, disorientation is a defect, since the affected person cannot serve as a consistent moral exemplar. Ami Harbin defends a contrary view: disorientation can be appreciated in morally positive ways. Disorientation is not defined precisely here; instead, the book highlights family resemblances among phenomena such as grief, migration, double-consciousness, queerness, profound illness and trauma. These are each treated with compassion, and often with psychological detail.

A different author might locate disorientation's value mostly in its transitional role, as a phase of struggle between the dissolution of an old orientation and the dawning of another orientation -- perhaps a wiser or less naïve one. If moral life demands radical changes to our ways of life, such changes might even call for practices of disorientation: dis-orienting ourselves, or dis-orienting others, from oppressive norms, habits, and values. But Harbin does not frame disorientation primarily as a transitional process, nor does she focus on whether and how one pattern of orientation might mark an improvement over another.

Instead, Harbin frames the experience of major disorientation as an unwelcome subjective predicament with uncertain results -- an experience that isn't properly chosen, either for ourselves or for others (86, 173). Nevertheless, she finds that coping with this experience often goes hand-in-hand with some important forms of moral agency, and that it may leave, in its wake, a number of positive shifts in a person's moral character.

By setting out to find moral fruit growing in the disorderly cracks of unsettling phenomena, Harbin contributes to the growing and vital field of non-ideal theory in ethics. There's great and urgent value in her argument against treating practical disorientation as an abject defect. The vast majority of human lives are not buoyed along by clear social recognition, stable supportive surroundings and bonds, and harmoniously-aligned practices. If some lives are assuredly "oriented," this fact is rarely a matter of mere luck; this privileged state is largely reproduced and protected through the marginalization, distortion, or exploitation of other lives. Moral theorists concerned with any kind of political liberation must attend, as this book does, to how moral agency can coexist with disruption, bewilderment, anxiety, and ambivalence.

Each of the book's core chapters (2-5) articulates and confronts one assumption in moral psychology that feeds into a bleak assessment of disoriented agents. Chapter 2 argues against "resolvism" -- the "assumption that to be morally motivated means that an agent acts with moral resolve . . . judging what must be done and how to do it, feeling confident about their prospective action, and enacting it" (42). (About this chapter I will say little; its negative argument is persuasive in the abstract, though it is reticent about naming any interlocutors who endorse or presuppose the doctrine in question.) Chapter 3 tackles the supposed value of single-minded clarity, highlighting the moral value of double-consciousness and disorientations associated with awareness of systemic injustices and oppressive norms. Chapter 4 resists the privileging of ease and confidence, considering how people may be "tenderized" by the experience of lacking ease. Chapter 5 addresses and resists the contention that it is only through "resolute" action that we can appropriately confront injustice.

Each of these core chapters pairs its moral psychology argument with discussion of one or more particular kinds of disorientation, reflecting on the ways people experience and respond to such disorientations. The final chapter reflects on the moral dangers of pathologizing, dismissing, and failing to support disoriented people. In addition to the moral virtues involved in responding to others' disorientation, Harbin recommends the humility of recognizing our own disorientability.

Exactly how, then, is disorientation valuable? Something like disorientation could occur in many valuable lives without yet being valuable (or, without having any value beyond a transitional function). Harbin's positive arguments seem to run along two paths. Though she does not emphasize the distinctness of these paths, I find them to diverge significantly, so I will consider each in turn.

The first argument path, which we can call the argument from tenderizing effects (echoing Harbin's own phrase) is not overtly political, and focuses mostly on how disorientations of "displacement" or "interruption" (99) can shift the character traits and priorities of a person who undergoes them. Experiences such as profound grief (Ch 2) and sustained illness (Ch 4) can thoroughly disrupt a person's habits, affects, expectations, and interests. These major disorientations are challenging enough in their own right, but Harbin shows how disoriented people also become the targets of others' misconceptions, stigma, denial, and impatience to "fix the problem." (Parallel observations have been made by theorists of disability.[1]) In the wake of such disorientation -- disorientation from both one's own life confidence and the social harmony of fitting in well with others -- a person may become "tenderized," more sensitive to others' struggles, and more open to "living unprepared."

These tenderizing effects do not reliably follow upon disorientation, so it's possible to wonder whether to credit them to disorientation as such (rather than, say, to some awareness that is loosely correlated with disorientation). Harbin's view that the experience itself is pivotal resonates with L.A. Paul's discussion of transformative experiences.[2] Some readers may still doubt that the morally transformative experiences here need to be disorientation experiences. Is it not common to see difficult experiences in general, of any kind, as nudging people toward "tender" recognition of others' differences and vulnerabilities? The special moral significance of major disorientation, here, may lie in how it cuts through one particularly tenacious illusion of autonomy and invulnerability -- namely, the stoic presumption that a person can always turn within, regardless of external and physical hardships, to find a reliable bedrock of clarity and resolve. Nothing levels us more than having the moral wind knocked out of us, so to speak.

Harbin's second way of revealing moral value in disorientation is more clearly political in tone. I'd summarize it as the argument from carrying tension (or even carrying contradictions in the Marxist sense -- though neither phrase here echoes Harbin's text). It involves appreciating patterns of agency that emerge from experiences such as double-consciousness (Ch 3), queerness (Ch 4) and coping with fundamentally unjust institutions (Ch 5). She tends to frame these as experiences of "ill-fit" (110), though "ill-fit" is still an oddly depoliticized way of marking such social realities. As noted above, systemic injustice presses many people into dilemmas and demoralizing conditions; living a straightforward and confidently oriented life becomes virtually impossible. So, if we would embrace the moral value of politically resistant agency under conditions that create such strains, we cannot afford to idealize perfect orientedness.

In a particularly intriguing discussion in Chapter 5, Harbin describes how struggles against institutional injustice can draw people into projects that seem at odds with one another. For example, an activist may be simultaneously committed to dismantling prisons (and/or settler colonialism, or the military, or institutionalized marriage), while also engaging in efforts to ameliorate suffering and injustice within those institutions. The latter activities will sometimes come across as accepting those unjust institutions, colluding with their practices and prolonging their viability. Hence, people who tack back and forth between radical and reformist strategies are bound to experience moral doubts and crises of conscience. Their lives hardly fit the image of the Aristotelian phronimos. Yet anyone who does not carry such tensions is missing a kind of sensibility that is vital in a systemically unjust world.[3]

Yet associating these patterns of moral value with "being disoriented" (where that rhetoric is glossed elsewhere in the book as being involuntarily without direction or unable to go on) seems misleading and even politically troubling. For all of these cases involve complex and dissonant orientations -- active hyperorientations, I might suggest -- rather than a lack of orientation altogether. And the moral benefits at issue here, as Harbin describes them, unfold through a rigorous attunement to the larger world, rather than through unchosen lostness and its tenderizing effects.

Moments of disorientation do figure, certainly, in many narratives of double-consciousness, queerness, and dilemmas of systemic injustice. In particular, a naïve person's initial encounter with brazen injustice and double-standards may bring shock (Bartky) and bewilderment (DuBois).[4] Yet "double-consciousness" emerges only on the far side of that encounter. Double-consciousness, in particular, implies living vigilantly with superimposed mappings (such that one map's place of opportunity is another map's hazard, etc.), rather than living without a map ("unprepared") altogether.

People who carry tension will experience uncertainty and dilemmas -- both about which path to prioritize and how to explain their priorities to a more neatly-oriented interlocutor. Yet the rhetoric of disorientation (being lost, confused, gone astray, fallen) can call agency into question, colluding easily with a dismissive stance. If orientation is a success-concept, disorientation is a failure-concept: the disoriented person fails to orient, or fails to orient properly.

So, while Harbin is understandably worried about how often people dismiss or resist someone's first-person confession of disorientedness (say, in the wake of grief), my reading of her book was haunted by a nearly opposite problem. When a person's attention and affect take subversive or taboo directions, describing the person as "disoriented" locates failure in the targeted individual, flattening social dissonance into a psychological malady.

Condescending diagnoses of disorientedness are of course given no legitimacy by Harbin's account. But the way she precludes them is by treating the state of disorientedness as a matter of first-person introspection and testimony. Alas, even in first-person narrative, I do not see how attributions of orientation and disorientation could insulate themselves from contestable hermeneutic priorities. To speak of either orientation or disorientation is to take an evaluative stance, recognizing some patterns of perception and action as more coherent than others. And a person may feel disoriented when others treat her choices as incoherent.

Might a supportive interpreter second-guess your confession of "disorientedness" insofar as the concept invokes not just a feeling, but a failure? For perhaps you are onto something here, you have your finger on threads of connection that others do not, or will not, feel. My obligation, as interpreter, may involve recognizing and amplifying, wherever possible, the coherence and viability of your embattled priorities.

No doubt, Harbin's intent is liberatory throughout: she seeks to render marginalized and conflicted agents more morally intelligible, not less. Yet the intellectual stance of this book (which is, to be fair, the stance of much moral psychology) misses out on some political and social insight by framing things like "disorientation" in static and individually internalized ways. Having embraced this contrast (between individuals in an "oriented" state and those in some kind of "disoriented" state), Harbin is right to affirm that the latter kind of person's moral qualities have been under-appreciated. This kind of sympathetic focus on the individual leads Harbin to warn against blaming people for their struggles with disorientedness, as well as against invoking the potential moral benefits of disorientation to defend or rationalize situations that cause such distress. Silver linings notwithstanding, the experience of going through a major disorientation is a bad and unchosen thing.

Yet the moral philosopher should recognize a dilemma here that is familiar to queer theorists. In many legal and social contexts, the safest bet has been to insist on the complete unchosenness of our (mis)alignments. This move promotes sympathy and tolerance, but at the cost of forfeiting the critical character of a queer pattern of life, one that is animated less by introspective confession than by the odyssey of disclosing a cover-up operation. The comfortably obvious life-corridors of "straightness" suddenly strike us not simply as givens, but as sites of maintenance that require the repression and refusal of possibilities. We head in a queer direction not when we have a feeling of ill-fit, but when we orient to our interactions as misfits. Though Harbin invokes Ahmed's Queer Phenomenology[5] with approval, Ahmed herself puts the activity of orienting at the constitutive boundaries of agency, and Harbin might have lingered more on such insights.

Double-consciousness under racism, too, might be embraced as a manifestation of attentive and resistant agency. This way of understanding double-consciousness helps emphasize not just the agency of those who carry tension under racism, but the agency that sustains racial privilege as well. Many white people, for example, may insist that they have engaged in nothing like "resolute" racist decisions; they simply "find themselves" following roadmaps that happen to collude with racist practices. Yet we need not treat their obliviousness (their non-orientation to the details of racism) simply as an unchosen lack; it too has been shaped through activity, both theirs and others'.

Similar reflections might apply even to the less-politicized phenomena of "displacement" such as grief. To look for agency in grief, as in queerness, is not to suppose that a person can or should "snap out of it" and get on with the attitudes and priorities of the majority. Rather, we might say, the grieving person attends to realities that most people prefer not to acknowledge. From a particular grieving point of view, some heartbreaking features of our shared world are salient -- features from which most non-grievers actively turn away. The more happily and resolutely the rest of us carry on (effectively gaslighting the grieving person's experience) the more isolated their experience becomes. It is indeed an injustice to ignore their distress and expect them to carry on as others do; yet it may also be an injustice to characterize them as "disoriented" individuals.

Like stigma, disorientation may be the kind of thing where, the closer we look, the less the crucial phenomena turn out to be in the individual at all. Nonetheless, it is of course vitally important to bear witness to how some people experience and learn from the turbulence that others have the luxury of keeping at a distance. Until we appreciate the challenges of responding to those experiences of dissonance, we cannot possibly have an adequate account of moral life. Wherever people's lives are shaped by sharp injustice, social-economic pressure, and profound loss, we should expect practical orientation to be far from simple. For insisting that we pay close attention to those who wrestle viscerally with problems of how to go on, Harbin's book is a vital intervention in moral philosophy.

[1] See, for example, Eli Clare, Brilliant Imperfection: Grappling with Cure (Duke, 2017)

[2] L.A. Paul, Transformative Experiences (Oxford, 2014) is not cited, but supports parts of Harbin’s argument.

[3] For this discussion, Harbin draws effectively on Lisa Tessman, Burdened Virtues (Oxford, 2005)

[4] Harbin references Sandra Bartky, Femininity & Domination (Routledge, 1990) and W.E.B. Du Bois, The Souls of Black Folk (Penguin, 1996).

[5] Sara Ahmed, Queer Phenomenology (Duke University Press, 2006).