Displacement by Development: Ethics, Rights and Responsibilities

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Peter Penz, Jay Drydyk, and Pablo S. Bose, Displacement by Development: Ethics, Rights and Responsibilities, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 343pp., $31.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521124645.

Reviewed by Laura Biron, Queens' College, University of Cambridge


Which ethical considerations come into play when individuals are displaced from their surroundings as a result of development projects? Although there is already much literature on this topic across a variety of disciplines, Displacement by Development can be distinguished from current literature in both its approach and its scope. In approach, Peter Penz, Jay Drydyk, and Pablo S. Bose argue that their perspective is new because it attempts to address displacement-induced development from an explicitly ethical perspective (p. 8). And the book also attempts to broaden current debates by putting forward an ethical framework that covers two sorts of cases: displacement for development, when individuals are directly displaced from their surroundings (through eviction or forced migration); and displacement by development, when the repercussive effects of a development project are less direct -- a reduction in fish stock as a result of building a dam, for example. The authors point out that the latter cases -- which are inevitably more complex to address -- are often neglected in both academic and policy analyses.

The overall project of the book, then, is to offer a new ethical framework for thinking about displacement by development, and this has both a negative and a positive component. It begins by surveying and critiquing some existing positions in the literature, identifying areas where debates have become polarised between extreme views and highlighting the weaknesses involved in methodological approaches reliant on cost-benefit analysis. But identifying shortcomings and gaps in current analyses in this manner paves the way for the establishment of the authors' own ethical framework, which they argue is not only new but also more expansive in its reach than existing frameworks. Although the claim to have put forward a completely new ethical framework may strike the reader as a little overstated -- especially in light of the fact that the framework they adopt explicitly draws on values already put forward in existing literature -- the book's attempt to improve, redefine and broaden existing frameworks should nonetheless be commended.

The book is divided into three parts. Part I outlines some current positions in debates about development policy, providing a helpful overview of the status quo. In particular, it draws attention to a debate between two competing approaches to the relationship between displacement and development: the managerialist approach and the movementist approach. According to the first, displacement is an inevitable consequence of development and is something to be managed and mitigated as a side-effect (mainly by governments), rather than something that warrants analysis in its own right at the outset of a proposed development project, and from the perspective of the individuals it could potentially harm. Conversely, the movementist approach focuses strongly on the rights of the individuals affected by development projects, arguing that projects go ahead only with their consent, and assuming on the whole that interventions in the name of development are harmful. Arguing that debates in development policy have become so 'polarised' between these two positions as to stifle progress, the authors help situate their own approach as a 'transformative middle ground' (p. 114) between the two: highlighting the importance of procedures that allow shared decision-making, without necessarily assuming that all development projects are harmful.

Part II begins by discussing a popular methodology in policy discussions of development: cost-benefit analysis, which often goes hand in hand with 'managerialist' approaches that focus on minimising displacement and mitigating its effects. Despite the fact that cost-benefit analysis raises an important issue of distributive justice -- that of compensation -- the authors consider it to be far too narrow an approach to yield normatively satisfying answers to the difficult questions raised by development induced displacement, mainly because it cannot give an adequate explanation for why certain deontological constraints should regulate development projects. Part II then goes on to review some of the current literature on displacement for development in policy settings, focusing on publications by the World Bank, the United Nations and the World Commission on Dams, criticising the former two, but praising the latter's report for its contribution to the debate and its focus on participatory decision-making, among other important values.

In Part III, the authors' own positive contribution to development ethics emerges, as they put forward an ethical framework that covers four areas: conditions, victimization, benefit-sharing and decision-making. The core normative commitment underlying their framework is that of non-maleficence, or not harming, which the authors suggest is important and uncontroversial enough to be agreed upon from a variety of perspectives. The framework then identifies seven values that constitute ethically responsible development: equity, participation, empowerment, cultural freedom, environmental sustainability, human rights and integrity. A large part of the remaining discussion focuses on the rights of individuals affected by displacement, the correlative responsibilities of policy-makers and other stakeholders to protect such rights, and some dilemmas that inevitably arise during this difficult process of identifying rights and allocating responsibilities. Finally, Part IV examines some practical applications of the framework, discussing in particular the Narmada valley project in India.

In light of its comprehensive scope, the book seems well placed to make a significant contribution to the field of development ethics. It offers a detailed account of debates and dilemmas that arise in cases of displacement by and for development. It is rooted in an appreciation of real case studies and examples, and as such enables the reader to see clearly the various applications of its approach. It provides a firm and authoritative sense of where current policy stands on this matter, and the limitations thereof. Moreover, it offers both an illuminating and comprehensive survey of current perspectives in the literature, as well as putting forward a comprehensive ethical framework that incorporates existing proposals whilst also adding new ethical considerations to the mix.

As is often the case with topics that are interdisciplinary and applied, yet draw on literature of a more abstract philosophical kind, there is a danger that practical concerns are emphasised at the expense of philosophical completeness. Although this is clearly a difficult challenge for any theorist working in applied ethics, it is worth drawing attention to a few areas of the book where greater philosophical precision would have been helpful either for the sake of clarity or, more fundamentally, to substantiate the ethical claims being made. As a matter of clarity, the book's distinction between normative and descriptive conceptions of development in Parts I and II did not seem to be a very illuminating way of classifying the conceptions of development under consideration. It would have been clearer if the authors had put it in terms of the prima facie assumption in much of the literature that development is fundamentally good (or conversely, the assumption on behalf of movementists that is harmful), and to distinguish the book's own conception of development through its neutrality, rather than its alleged 'normativity' or otherwise. Moreover, the attempt to use non-maleficence as a bedrock value from which to derive the various aspects of the ethical framework would have benefited from further elaboration. First, it is not clear that non-maleficence itself is a 'bedrock' value, because there is a further question to be raised, namely: why should we endorse and promote non-maleficence? Second, theorists of human rights may be troubled by the book's suggestion that the diverse and rich normative claims such rights protect should be seen as dependent on one unifying and rather minimal principle of non-maleficence.

Finally, it is worth asking whether the book might have contained a more explicit attempt to link some of the ethical questions it considers beyond the case of displacement by development and to some already well-established debates in other areas of applied philosophy, such as biomedical ethics. Indeed, the book considers two debates which are very similar to discussions in this field, yet no attempt was made to connect them. First, in chapter eight, the authors offer an illuminating and powerful critique of appeals to consent in settling dilemmas about displacement, suggesting that consent can be both too strong and too weak an ethical requirement in such contexts. This discussion of consent would no doubt be enriched if connected to an area like biomedical ethics, where appeals to 'informed consent' have also come under scrutiny in recent years. Second, the book's general focus on prioritising decision-making procedures for settling disputes about displacement appears very familiar to the popular claim in medical priority-setting contexts that procedural values should be established before disputes between substantive and competing normative theories can be settled. For readers interested more generally in applied ethics, these may seem like missed opportunities to connect development ethics with closely related fields.

Overall, Displacement by Development provides both a comprehensive account of current dilemmas in development ethics and a clear diagnosis of the weaknesses of some current solutions to these dilemmas. Although the framework it puts forward may not strike readers as quite as 'new' as the authors suggest, this should by no means be considered a disadvantage; it seems clear that to make progress in this thorny area of policy, an approach is needed that is comprehensive enough to appeal to theorists already versed in the development ethics literature, without simply accepting that there is no room for improvement. Even if philosophically minded readers will quibble with some of the finer points of the ethical framework put forward, they will no doubt admire the fact that it stands a significant chance of making an impact at the level of policy; if indeed this were to be the case, one might well concede that there are situations in which philosophical completeness might need to be sacrificed for the sake of broader practical agreement.