Dispositions and Causal Powers

Placeholder book cover

Max Kistler and Bruno Gnassounou (eds.), Dispositions and Causal Powers, Ashgate, 2007, 303pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780754654254.

Reviewed by Jennifer McKitrick, University of Nebraska, Lincoln


Quine claimed that dispensing with disposition terms, such as "intelligent" or even "water-soluble," is a mark of the maturity of a branch of science.[1] The contributors to this collection couldn't disagree more. While some may disagree about whether dispositions cause or explain their manifestations, or whether powers can supplant or make sense of laws of nature, as the editors note, they all agree that "dispositions and causal powers are an essential and indispensable part of our conceptual scheme" (31) including our scientific practices.

This volume is a welcome contribution to the literature, a must-read for anyone working on or interested in dispositions. It is ideal for a graduate-level course or seminar in metaphysics or philosophy of science. In addition to dispositions and powers, this collection sheds light on a number of issues, especially causation and laws of nature. The book is divided into two parts: The Metaphysics of Dispositions and Causal Powers, and Dispositions and Causal Powers in Science. However, even the selections from the metaphysics section are written with an eye towards being informed by and applicable to science.

It is perhaps a weakness of the collection that there is not more debate and disagreement. All the contributors are opposed to any sort of conceptual reduction and most agree that dispositions are real, causally relevant properties. While Tiercelin raises some questions for the dispositional realist to address, the only real debate is between Cartwright and Hutteman on the one hand, who think that powers are needed to make sense of ceteris paribus laws, and Shrenk on the other, who argues that powers are not up to the task.

Furthermore, the collection is slightly dated, as it is based on a 2002 conference and doesn't reflect much work of the last several years. For example, Mumford's Dispositions (1998) is much discussed, while his views have significantly changed over the past decade.

The editors' Introduction is an excellent survey of the history of philosophical reflection on powers and dispositions. The typical characterization of this history, encapsulated by Moliere's jest about the "dormitive virtue" of opium, is that medieval philosophers and scholastics posited occult powers to explain things and the modern philosophers showed how such explanations were inadequate. Gnassounou and Kistler show that the actual history, from Aristotle through the Early Modern philosophers and the Logical Empiricists, was much more complex than most contemporary philosophers appreciate. The introduction concludes with helpful summaries of each contribution.

Francois Schmitz's "Dispositions and Counterfactuals. From Carnap to Goodman's Children and Grandchildren" also explains part of the history of thinking on dispositions. However, this selection has more than historical interest, as it shows the relevance of historical problems to contemporary views.

According to a simple material conditional analysis of dispositions:

For all x, x has disposition D if and only if, if x is in circumstance C, x exhibits manifestation M.

This analysis has the problematic consequence that everything that is not in circumstance C has disposition D. So, for example, everything that is not submerged in water is water-soluble.

As Schmitz explains, Carnap tried to improve on this with his conditional analysis:

For all x, if x is in circumstance C, x exhibits manifestation M if and only if x has disposition D.

However, Carnap's analysis has the consequence that if something is not in circumstance C, it is indeterminate whether it has D. Some theorists, such as Frege and Chisholm, would find such indeterminacy problematic, especially for scientific applications.

According to a contemporary counterfactual analysis:

For all x, x has disposition D if and only if, if x were in circumstance C, x would exhibit manifestation M.

According to a Lewisian possible worlds semantics for counterfactuals, this means that x exhibits M in the closest possible world in which x is in C.

Schmitz argues that a counterfactual analysis of dispositions suffers from the same problems as Carnap's analysis. One problem is that we don't know if x exhibits M in the closest x-in-C-world unless we already know that x has D. If we don't know whether an object has a disposition, the counterfactual analysis is no help in figuring it out. So, Schmitz argues, there are cases in which one cannot determine whether or not the dispositional concept applies. As it did for Carnap's analysis, this region of indeterminacy means that dispositions aren't scientifically acceptable.

However, the problems for the two analyses seem somewhat different. In the case where x is not in C, the consequence of the Carnapian analysis is not that we can't figure out whether or not "x is D" is true or false. The indeterminacy is not merely epistemological. The consequence of Carnap's analysis is that, in this case, "x is D" is neither true nor false.

It's not clear that the counterfactual analysis suffers from the same problem. Taking it at face-value that "x is D" means that, in the closest possible world in which x is in C, x exhibits M, either x is exhibiting M in that world or it isn't. Seeing as we have no telescope for peering into other possible worlds, we can't tell, and so perhaps we are not in a position to tell whether x is D in that world. It doesn't seem to follow that "x is D" is neither true nor false. If there is indeterminacy, it's epistemic. The counterfactual analysis of dispositions does not provide one with a discovery or decision procedure for determining whether a given object has a disposition. It's not clear any account of what disposition terms mean could, by itself, answer such empirical questions.

In "The Causal Efficacy of Macroscopic Dispositional Properties" Max Kistler argues that while dispositions of objects with parts (what he calls macroscopic dispositions) may be reducible to more fundamental properties, such dispositions are not identical to their reducing properties, but they can have causal powers of their own. Kistler joins Armstrong, Shoemaker, and others in claiming that the dispositional/categorical distinction applies to predicates, not properties, and that any natural property can be conceived of as either categorical or dispositional. To defend the causal efficacy of dispositions he distinguishes two senses of 'categorical basis' of a disposition, one being a macro-property, the disposition conceived of categorically, the other being the microscopic property, or reduction base, which nomologically determines the macro-property. According to Kistler, a disposition is identical to the categorical base in the first sense, but not the second.

However, it's not clear how these terminological moves help to defend the causal efficacy of dispositions. Consider a common exclusion argument against the causal efficacy of dispositions:

1) A disposition and its categorical basis are two distinct properties.

2) In the circumstances of manifestation, the categorical basis is sufficient for the manifestation of the disposition.

3) If the instantiation of a set of properties is sufficient to bring about a certain effect, then all other properties are causally inefficacious with respect to that effect.


4) Dispositions with categorical bases are causally inert.

Taking Kistler's disambiguation of 'categorical basis' into account, and putting 'reduction base' in its place, we can formulate an argument that is as problematic as its predecessor. Kistler considers such an argument and in effect accepts (1) and (2) and rejects (3) in favor of the weaker claim: If the instantiation of a set of properties is sufficient to bring about a certain effect, then all independent properties are causally inefficacious with respect to that effect. Kistler argues that since the reduction base nomologically determines the disposition, the properties are not independent, and the argument does not go through.

In "What Makes a Capacity a Disposition?" Nancy Cartwright claims that there are different kinds of non-categorical properties, in particular dispositions and powers on the one hand and capacities on the other. According to Cartwright, while both dispositions and capacities can be distinguished from their manifestations, a disposition can sometimes fail to exhibit its manifestation (in other words, a disposition can be latent) while some capacities are such that they are always manifesting. Dispositions are further distinguished from capacities in that they are "malleable" -- they can be triggered, enhanced, or diminished.

While it is plausible that there are different kinds of non-categorical properties, the rationale for Cartwright's way of drawing this particular distinction is not clear from this selection. Is she giving a conceptual analysis? If so, whose concepts is she analyzing? Many English speakers might take the terms 'power' and 'capacity' to be synonymous. If she's offering precising definitions of these terms, to what end?

Furthermore, it's questionable whether Cartwright's distinctions hold up. Her prime example of a capacity is gravitational capacity. In accord with her distinction, gravity is not malleable -- it cannot be triggered, enhanced or diminished. But, despite her notice of the "two-sidedness" of capacities, Cartwright seems to be conflating the capacity with its manifestation. (Shrenk makes a similar point in his chapter.) What is the manifestation of the gravitational capacity supposed to be? If it is the gravitational force, arguably that does not get triggered, or altered as long as the mass of the object remains the same. But what's the difference between gravitational capacity and gravitational force? Do we really need two things instead of one: gravitational capacity, which is always manifesting, and its manifestation, the force of gravity? If the manifestation of the gravitational capacity were, say, the motions of massive objects, Cartwright's claim that the gravitational capacity is not malleable looks less plausible. The manifestation could be triggered if something gets close enough to something to get it to move, diminished by a force pulling the object in the opposite direction, and enhanced by an additional force pulling the object in the same direction.

Another reason Cartwright distinguishes dispositions from capacities is that all dispositions are possibly latent. However, this is also open to question. I doubt that Cartwright would call the stability of an office building a capacity, since her examples of capacities are all fundamental physical forces. However, there doesn't seem to be any such thing as latent stability. If the building isn't manifesting stability, it doesn't have it. So, there's a disposition that is always manifesting, which calls Cartwright's distinction further into doubt.

In "Causation, Laws and Dispositions" Andreas Hüttemann explains that laws of nature describe how systems would behave if they were isolated -- if there were no interfering factors. But in reality, there always are interfering factors. Hüttemann argues that the only way to make sense of laws operating in non-ideal circumstances is to suppose that the laws describe the dispositions of the system. These dispositions must be continuously manifestable. This doesn't mean, as the name might suggest, that they lack latency, but rather that they can exhibit their manifestations as a matter of degree. (So if Cartwright is right that gravitational capacity cannot be diminished, it cannot support the law of gravity.)

In "Can Capacities Rescue us from Ceteris Paribus Laws?" Markus Shrenk notes that most laws of nature seem to be true only ceteris paribus, which puts them in danger of being tautologous, untestable, and incapable of supporting counterfactuals. Several authors in this volume (Tiercelin, Michon, Harré, and Hüttemann) suggest that dispositions can somehow solve these problems. Shrenk argues for the contrary position by pointing out problems that flow from the well-known fact that when a disposition is triggered, its manifestation occurs ceteris paribus. The same problems that plague ceteris paribus laws creep back at the level of dispositions.

In "Dispositions, Relational Properties and the Quantum World," Mauro Dorato argues that quantum states are dispositional because they are relational and non-definite. However, it's not clear that such features of a state go to show that it is dispositional.

Dorato claims that dispositions are relational properties for the following reasons: Solubility needs interaction with a liquid to manifest itself, and odorousness needs interaction with nostrils to manifest itself. However, this strikes me as a confusion. A property may stand in some relation to an object or substance, but that doesn't make the property itself a relation. A thing can have a disposition and not exhibit its manifestation. That is to say, the dispositional property fails to stand in the requite relation to the triggering substance or object. If the disposition can exist without the relation, the disposition cannot be a relation. If dispositions aren't relations, Dorato's reasoning fails.

The other reason Dorato gives for thinking quantum states are dispositions is also problematic. He equates dispositions with non-definite properties and claims that the passage from disposition to manifestation is the same thing as the passage from indefiniteness to definiteness. However, it's not clear why dispositional should be equated with indefinite -- properties that are objectively without a precise, possessed value. It seems that a copper wire can have a precise degree of conductivity, and a trigger on a gun requires a precise amount of pressure before it will fire, etc.

If quantum states were dispositions, and Mumford's functional characterization of dispositions is as correct as Dorato claims it is, quantum states would be dispositions to produce certain manifestations in certain circumstances -- such as a disposition to produce a reading of "spin up" if the polarizing filter is at 33 degrees, and "spin down" if at 66 degrees. But those functional characterizations sound like mysterious instructions appropriate for a hidden-variables interpretation of quantum mechanics, rather than something neutral between the various interpretations, as Dorato claims.

There's also something puzzling about Anouk Barberousse's example of specific heat as a disposition in "Are Specific Heats Dispositions?" Specific heat is defined as the quantity of heat a sample must absorb in order to increase its temperature by 1 degree. Barberousse defends the idea that this is a disposition by citing an associated conditional (roughly):

If the temperature of the sample was raised by 1 degree, it would absorb x amount of heat.

This is said to be typical of a disposition expressing statement, that is, a statement about how a thing is disposed to respond to a stimulus. In this vein, a generic disposition expressing statement would say something like: "If the stimulus were to occur, the manifestation would occur." So, in the case of specific heat, the stimulus must be the temperature of the sample rising 1 degree, and the manifestation must be the sample absorbing x amount of heat. This seems odd. Does the rising temperature of the sample trigger it to absorb heat? This suggests that the sample's temperature rises prior to its absorbing heat, which seems odd. If there's a disposition expressing statement associated with specific heats, Barberousse has not clearly identified it.

I regret that I only have space to briefly mention the other valuable contributions to this collection. Stephen Mumford's "Filled in Space" attempts to allay Humean suspicions about dispositions which are not grounded in non-dispositional properties. Claudine Tiercelin's "Dispositions and Essences" consider the case for dispositional or scientific essentialism, according to which a thing's powers are essential to it. Cyrille Michon's "Opium's Virtus Dormitiva" defends the idea that a disposition can causally explain its manifestation. Bruno Gnassounou's "Conditional Possibility" raises further difficulties for reducing disposition claims to conditional statements. Ludger Jansen's "On Ascribing Dispositions" argues that while dispositions can be attributed to classes, general properties and property instances, their attribution to particulars is most fundamental. And in "An Extended Semantic Field of Dispositions and the Grounding Role of Causal Powers," Rom Harré further supports the essentiality of dispositional concepts by arguing that the aim of physics it to explain observed regularities by postulating unobservable powers.

[1] "Natural Kinds" in Ontological Relativity and Other Essays (New York: Columbia University Press, 1969, pp. 114-138).