Disputed Questions on the Virtues

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Thomas Aquinas, Disputed Questions on the Virtues, E. M. Atkins (ed., trans.) and Thomas Williams (ed.), Cambridge University Press, 2005, 344pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521776619.

Reviewed by R. E. Houser, University of St. Thomas, Houston


The development of "virtue ethics" in the English philosophical world, as a reaction to various forms of consequentialism, deontology, and moral skepticism, has been well under way for some time. In retrospect, it can now be seen that Anscombe's "Modern Moral Philosophy" (1958) and Geach's The Virtues (1977) were the first swallows announcing the spring that began with Alasdair MacIntyre's After Virtue (1981). It was only a matter of time before translators began to offer the wisdom of pre-modern Greek and Latin virtue theorists, for in the dawning post-modern era the hold of "modern" Western thought is rapidly waning.

Among the most prominent of these earlier moralists was Thomas Aquinas. Selections on the virtues from the Summa Theologiae 2-2 have not been available in book form for a long time. But recently there have appeared some translations of Aquinas's disputed questions, where he had the advantage of being able to develop particular arguments more fully than in the Summa, intended as it was "for teaching beginners." Some questions from the disputations on the virtues, composed when Aquinas was writing 2-2, have been translated by others, but the whole set is translated by E. M. Atkins for the first time.

So there is a marked need for this translation. Students and professors of philosophy without Latin make up an especially important audience. Atkins translates all five questions in the series: On the Virtues in General; On Charity; On Brotherly Correction; On Hope; and On the Cardinal Virtues. The introduction is by Thomas Williams, and both he and Atkins are listed as editors. There is a brief but important comment on terminology, designed to justify Atkins's approach to translation, a glossary of some tricky terms, a useful table of parallel questions, and three indices. The Marietti edition of the Latin text is notoriously corrupt, and the translator is to be commended for obtaining permission to use the Leonine Commission's "provisional text," begun by Emile Deronne, OP, but still unpublished.

Williams's "Introduction" is very useful, designed to situate the virtues in relation to other major parts of Aquinas's moral theory. He begins with the natural law, whose "precepts provide the necessary anchor for practical reasoning," moves to "human agency," the cardinal virtues, and finally the theological virtues. Williams presents Aquinas as a natural law moralist.

One slight demur. While Williams justifies his approach by quoting 1-2.94.1 ad 2 [not 3, as cited], "the precepts of the natural law … are the first principles of human acts," in On Evil at 2.6c, Aquinas himself compares law and virtues this way:

So then too by their opposition to the virtues, sins differ in species according to their diverse matters, for example homicide, adultery, and theft. Nor should it be said that they differ in species according to a difference of precepts but rather the reverse. Precepts are distinguished according to the difference of virtues and vices because the purpose of the precepts is that we act according to virtue and avoid sins. (trans. Oesterle)

If the natural law is a beginning, it is no more "the necessary anchor" than are the virtues, which are ends of Aquinas's moral theory, a large vessel needing more than one anchor.

The translation is generally clear and offers the beginning reader the highlights of Aquinas's virtue theory. But for careful readers the translation is disappointing. Aquinas wrote a Latin filled with precisely used technical terms (Thomas semper loquitur formalissime), and here is where problems crop up. Consider the following passages (I have highlighted problem terms, and commented on some of them):

On Hope, 1 ad 7m, p. 223:

The reason that moral virtues are found in a mid-point is that they have to observe the standard of reason in respect of their distinctive and per se object, i.e. human emotions and behaviour

Ad septimum dicendum, quod ideo virtutes morales consistunt in medio, quia ad virtutem moralem pertinet attingere regulam rationis circa proprium et per se obiectum, scilicet circa passiones et operationes humanas.

Most effective here are the traditional renderings "moral virtues" and "object." Per se, however, is a real problem, because it is used in English, usually without precision. Here proprium and per se modify obiectum, but they do not mean the same thing. Aquinas's model is Aristotle's analysis of the "objects" of sensation at De anima 2.6, divided first into per accidens (his example is "the son of Diares") and per se objects, then the latter are subdivided into commune (such as "shape") and proprium (such as "color"). Aquinas uses this scheme to great effect throughout his treatment of the virtues. The objects of the moral virtues are not just "essential (per se)" but "proper (proprium)," like color rather than shape. Traditional translations like these would show a necessary connection between moral virtues as habits in the soul and their objects, and would indicate that temperance and justice, for instance, are going to differ through having different objects. In addition, "proper" would also tune the reader into the doctrine of the five predicables -- genus, species, difference, property, and accident -- which would clarify proprium here. Neither the translation nor the explanation of proprium in the glossary (p. 281) hints at the doctrine of the predicables.

On Hope, 2c, p. 227:

Conversely, the sensory desire, which has as its object something good under a particular description, is divided between aggresion and sensual desire, in accordance with the different descriptions of the goods perceived by the senses.

Et ideo appetitus sensitivus, cuius obiectum est bonum secundum rationem particularem, dividitur in irascibilem et concupiscibilem, secundum diversas rationes boni sensibilis.

Aquinas holds that passions, spontaneously produced in animals and humans as a result of their sense experiences, are one kind of actualization of a type of power he calls "appetite (appetitus)," which produces inclinations arising from cognition. "Appetite" is divided into "intellectual appetite (appetitus intellectualis)," or will, and "sense appetite (appetitus sensitivus)," because intellectual and sense cognition are different. Sense appetite is further divided using Platonic terms, into "irascible (irasciblis)," from "anger (ira)," and "concupiscible (concupiscibilis)," from "to desire (concupisco)." I am sympathetic with Atkins's desire to do more than the first English Domincans (1920) and subsequent translators, who simply transliterated the Latin as "irascible" and "concupiscible." But her solution won't work. She translates appetitus as "desire," calls the species "sensory desire," and then the sub-species "sensual desire." But a non-Latinate reader simply will not see any difference between "sensory" and "sensual" desire. Nor does "aggression" work, because it omits "endurance," the passive side of the "irascible" power. And while "desire" works for concupiscibilis, it will not do at all for appetitus intellectualis. For will acts are the very opposite of spontaneous and non-intellectual "desires," they are studied and intellectual. Atkins's translation renders Aquinas an emotivist. An alternative would render this series of technical terms respectively as: "appetite," "intellectual appetite," "sense appetite," "emotion," and "desire."

Another problem here is "under a particular description." A contemporary philosopher uses this phrase to mean 'under one description rather than another one,' say, 'robber' rather than 'thief.' But Aquinas says "particular" in order to contrast the particular objects of "sense appetite" with the object of will or intellectual appetite, which introduces universality into the picture. "Under the aspect of the particular" or "under a particular aspect" would be better.

On the virtues in general, 3, p. 16 and 18:

Whether a capacity of the soul can be a possessor of virtue.

Utrum potentia animae possit esse virtutis subiectum.

In this way, we conclude that the virtues are possessed by the capacity of the soul, because virtue exists in the soul, through the mediation of capacities.

Sic ergo dicendum est, potentias esse virtutum subiecta; quia virtus animae inest, potentia mediante.

Here the problem involves four related terms: subiectum, potentia, dispositio, and habitus. The problem with "possessor" is that it reifies a power of the soul, making it the thing that possesses a virtue, whereas in reality it is the human who possesses the virtue. The problem with "capacity" is that this English term is passive. Aquinas distinguishes active and passive powers. When he uses potentia of God ("The capacity of God is like this," p. 6), Atkins recognizes the problem (n. 1): "In English we normally refer to God's potentia as 'power', because it is activated of itself and always." But this is the problem, not the solution. Atkins also objects to translating habitus as "habit." Her solution is to translate it as "disposition," which makes it impossible to use the same word for dispositio, which becomes "tendency." When the non-Latinate reader encounters "disposition" in the other available translations of Aquinas, two technical terms become confused, not just one.

The primary purpose of a translation such as this one is to help the reader learn what Aquinas said in particular texts. This the reader can do, but in spite of, not because of, its eccentric vocabulary. Secondly, a translation should also lead the reader to other works of Thomas's, and to the tradition in which he wrote. But this translation tends to isolate Aquinas from that tradition, much as many Europeans now think of themselves as cut off from their own European and Christian tradition. But on that subject, better to listen to a European pope than to me.