Disputed Questions on Virtue

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Thomas Aquinas, Disputed Questions on Virtue, Jeffrey Hause and Claudia Eisen Murphy (trs.), Introduction and Commentary by Jeffrey Hause, Hackett, 2010, 398pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780872209251.

Reviewed by R. E. Houser, University of St. Thomas (Houston, TX)


The development of "virtue ethics" in the English philosophical world is now running at full speed. Some philosophers, still writing in the spirit of "modern philosophy," have approached the subject without concern for history. But beginning with After Virtue (1981), the founder of the turn toward the virtues, Alasdair MacIntyre, has shown how unsophisticated is a non-historical approach to this topic. At the dawn of the "post-modern" era, the hold of "modern" Western thought is rapidly loosening. So it was predictable that for a reading audience without benefit of Greek and Latin, translations of pre-modern philosophers would begin to appear.

While composing the moral part of his Summa theologiae during his second Parisian regency (1268-1272), Br. Thomas of Aquino took his graduate theology students through a series of five disputed questions on the virtues: On the Virtues in General; On Charity; On Brotherly Correction; On Hope; and On the Cardinal Virtues. The nature of disputations offered him the time to go into the topics covered more thoroughly than he could in the Summa. Recent English translations of note include a 2004 translation of On the Cardinal Virtues, a complete translation in 2005 of all five disputations, and now this complete translation in 2010. The present effort is published by modestly priced Hackett, so it should have a wide audience.

While the Hackett translations of Aquinas over the years have had mixed quality, this one is a "gem", and Hause and Murphy are to be congratulated. Its strong points are numerous and important. The translation is clear and faithful. A real advantage is using the as yet unpublished Leonine text, which is significantly superior to the Marietti edition. The translators retain the disputed question format. And the whole series is translated. Hause offers an extended commentary which is solid and helpful for beginning readers, though he could have paid more attention to the history of the doctrine. The bibliography is up to date, and the index, though limited, is useful. The most important advantage, however, is that the translators quite consciously have chosen to make use of the English scholastic vocabulary that has built up over the centuries since Locke, rather than the more eccentric style of translation begun with the English Dominican translation of the Summa in the 1960s.

Consider On Hope, Art. 1, which contains Aquinas's most extensive comparison of the "formal" and "material" objects of a virtue, which is crucial for the theological virtues, since they all have God for their "object." His summary:

Sic igitur, sicut formale obiectum fidei est veritas prima, per quam sicut per quoddam medium assentit his quae creduntur, quae sunt materiale obiectum fidei; ita etiam formale obiectum spei est auxilium divinae potestatis et pietatis, propter quod tendit motus spei in bona sperata, quae sunt materiale obiectum spei.

The 2005 translation renders this as:

Now the form of the object of faith is the first truth, and we assent to the content of faith through this, as if through a mediator; the matter of the object of faith is just that content of faith. In the same way, then, the form of the object of hope is the help that comes from God's power and compassion, since our hope is stirred by these towards the goods for which we hope; the matter of the object of hope is just those goods.

Hause/Murphy, meanwhile, translate the passage thus:

It follows from these considerations that faith's formal object is the First Truth, through which, as through a means, we assent to the things that are believed, which are faith's material object. In parallel fashion, hope's formal object is the help we gain from God's power and compassion, thanks to which hope's motion is directed to the hoped-for goods, which are its material object.

The italicized words and phrases show the superiority of Hause/Murphy. Consider four points: (1) "Formal object" and "material object" avoid confusion that is possible because Aquinas has just said that faith and hope both "have two objects"; but he does not mean two completely separate objects, but two aspects (rationes) of one object. (2) "Means" is better because "mediator" takes our minds toward Christ, which is not the point here. (3) "Content of faith" inevitably leads us toward "mental content," say, propositions. But our mental content is a means "by which" we become aware of the realities we believe in: God, Christ, the church. (4) "Hope is stirred" loses all notion of internally generated action and, worse, it tends to conflate the theological virtue of hope with the passion of hope, which certainly can be "stirred" up by our experiences. Even Hause/Murphy, however, renders tendit passively. I would suggest "hope's motion tends."

No translation will be perfect; and it is the duty of the reviewer to point out even a few weaknesses. There should be a full table of contents, one that gives the titles of the thirty-six articles. There should be a Lexicon showing how technical Latin terms were translated. While accurate, the translation could read more smoothly and formally, to capture the style of Aquinas's Latin. Occasionally the translation slips into an outline, which is the job of the commentary and can obscure Aquinas's argument, as in the responsio of On the Cardinal Virtues, Art. 1.

While it retains the disputed question format, Hause/Murphy has changed the traditional headings. "Reasons to think it is/does not," "Opposing considerations," "Responses to the initial arguments" seem weak to me. Where disputed questions show the medieval classroom to be a place for forceful and forthright "battles of ideas," these headings resonate of the weaker commitment to reason we witness in the contemporary classroom that has lost its faith in reason.

Let me end "down in the weeds" with text editing. While the translators have used the "provisional Leonine text," they admit: "In a few cases we have amended [they mean emended, see OED under emendation] the text, most often in keeping with the earlier but largely reliable Marietti edition." But on p. 61 they change operationes to virtutes without reference to Marietti and against the manuscripts and the provisional Leonine text. The emendation is wrong.

These small criticisms, however, should not obscure the fine job that the translators have done. Even for Aquinas, who semper loquitur formalissime, first rate translations are hard to come by; and we have one here.