Dissensus: On Politics and Aesthetics

Placeholder book cover

Jacques Rancière, Dissensus: On Politics and Aesthetics, Steven Corcoran (ed., tr.), Continuum, 2010, 230 pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847064455.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University



Whenever a French philosopher begins to become fashionable, one can expect a growing cascade of translations of his work. Not only will the major and minor texts appear, but also various sorts of collected writings. The general purpose of the latter is often ostensibly to provide an introduction to the thinker’s work, but many of these collections often turn out to be hodge-podges of writings with no coherent internal connection whose real goal is to shore up the failing fortunes of a small press.

This is emphatically not the case with the collection under review. Steven Corcoran has provided a timely and coherently organized collection of Rancière’s short writings, one that can stand as a solid introduction to the author’s thought. Corcoran comes to the task already conversant with Rancière’s work, having translated two other works of Rancière’s, Hatred of Democracy and Aesthetics and its Discontents, as well as a number of books by Rancière’s intellectual colleague Alain Badiou.

Constructing an introduction like this one to Rancière’s work presents a singular challenge. One can mark two distinct but related periods in his “mature” work, which cover two distinct but related themes: politics and aesthetics. The former period might be said, a bit arbitrarily, to begin with the 1987 appearance of The Ignorant Schoolmaster, and culminates with Disagreement, published in 1995. The latter period perhaps starts with the 1998 publication of Silent Speech (forthcoming in English) and continues to the present day. Such a dating is a bit arbitrary, however, since there are aesthetic writings from before 1998 and political writings from after that date. There is a distinct shift of emphasis that occurs in Rancière’s writings around the late 1990’s, however, and the task of a good collection would be to capture both periods and the thematic interaction between them. The writings gathered here, which date from 1996 to 2004, perform both tasks admirably.

For Rancière, politics is not a matter of what people receive or demand. It is not a matter of the institutional creation of just social arrangements. Rather, it is a matter of what people do, and in particular what they do that challenges the hierarchical order of a given set of social arrangements. To challenge such a hierarchical order is to act under the presupposition of one’s own equality. Such action, if it is political, is going to be collective rather than individual. It will concern a group of people (or a subset of that group) who have been presupposed unequal by a particular hierarchical order, as well as those in solidarity with them, acting as though they were indeed equal to those above them in the order, and thus disrupting the social order itself. What are disrupted are not only the power arrangements of the social order, but, and more deeply, the perceptual and epistemic underpinnings of that order, the obviousness and naturalness that attaches to the order. Such a disruption is what Rancière calls a dissensus. Described this way, one can begin to see its interaction with aesthetic concerns. A dissensus is not merely a disagreement about the justice of particular social arrangements, although it is that as well. It is also the revelation of the contingency of the entire perceptual and conceptual order in which such arrangements are embedded, the contingency of what Rancière calls le partage du sensible, the partition or distribution of the sensible.

Aesthetics is also a challenge to a particular partition of the sensible, but in a different way. Before we understand how it challenges the sensible, however, we must bear in mind that aesthetics is not, in Rancière’s use, a reference term for art as a whole, but rather for a particular regime of artistic practice, a regime in which, as Corcoran notes in his excellent introduction to the volume, “the field of experience, severed from its traditional reference points, is therefore open for new restructurings through the ‘free play’ of aestheticization.” (p. 17) This free play is one that reveals the contingency of a particular partition of the sensible by constructing another one, one based not upon the hierarchy of the current partition but upon certain “equalities,” for example the equal aesthetic worthiness of all subjects, activities, and objects. (One might consider here one of Rancière’s favorite examples, Madame Bovary, in which the adultery of a bourgeois woman is considered as aesthetically worthy of treatment as the exploits of a heroic character.) An aesthetic practice, then, like politics, is a dissensus from a given partition of the sensible. As Rancière notes, “Art and politics each define a form of dissensus, a dissensual re-configuration of the common experience of the sensible.” (p. 140)

The difference between politics and aesthetics lies in the character of the dissensual movements they create. The aesthetic movement of politics "consists above all in the framing of a we, a subject of collective demonstration whose emergence is the element that disrupts the distribution of social parts." (pp. 141-2) The political character of aesthetics, by contrast,

does not give a collective voice to the anonymous. Instead, it re-frames the world of common experience as the world of a shared impersonal experience. In this way, it aids to help create the fabric of a common experience in which new modes of constructing common objects and new possibilities of subjective enunciation may be developed. (p. 142)

While intertwined, then, politics and aesthetics remain distinct types of dissensus, a point Rancière also insists upon in what may be his most widely read book in English, The Politics of Aesthetics.

If the texts gathered in Dissensus are often focused on the relation of politics to aesthetics, this is not to the detriment of Rancière’s particular treatments of each. The politics section offers a coherent set of essays that give a strong sense of Rancière’s view of the general character of politics as well as some of his more topical views. It begins with “Ten Theses on Politics,” a summation of the political perspective Rancière develops in Disagreement. It moves on to discussions of his view of democracy and consensus. The latter concept is particularly important to an understanding of Rancière’s work, for two reasons. First, it is against the background of consensus that his idea of dissensus is developed. Second, the concern with consensus forms a bridge between Rancière’s more theoretical concerns and his interventions into topical politics, which are the focus of the last several essays in the section on politics. In Rancière’s view, we are living in a time of consensus, which does not mean that everyone agrees with all the public policies promoted by the elites, but rather that there is a general agreement that the partition of the sensible and its distribution of roles is a reasonable one, and that there is no reasonable alternative to it. As he succinctly puts the point in Chronique des temps consensuels,

The consensus that governs us is a machine of power insofar as it is a machine of vision. It pretends to verify only what everyone can see by adjusting two propositions on the state of the world: one which says that we are finally at peace, and the other which announces the condition of this peace: the recognition that there is only what there is. (Paris: Seuil, 2005, p. 8)

I should note that two of the smaller pieces in the section on politics will be of interest not only to introductory students of Rancière’s thought, but also those more conversant with his work. “The People or the Multitudes?” distinguishes Rancière’s concept of the people from Hardt and Negri’s concept of the multitude. In that piece, Rancière argues that in order for there to be a politics, there must be a dissensus or a break with the established order. This dissensus is obscured in Hardt and Negri’s adoption of Deleuze’s expressive immanence, and in fact is dismissed as a paranoid reaction. However, it finds its way back into their thought when they turn toward specific interventions. “Biopolitics or Politics?” distinguishes Foucault’s conception of biopower from that of Agamben and more recent thinkers, and shows the alignment of Rancière’s thought with the former but not with the latter.

The aesthetics section is, in keeping with Rancière’s writings, a little more elusive than the politics section. This is in part because, in his view, the aesthetic regime is constituted by paradoxes, and the project of art in the aesthetic regime is to navigate these paradoxes without reducing one side of the paradox to the other. For instance, in aesthetics there is no particular border that separates art from life; however, art is not the same thing as life either. The challenge confronting contemporary artists, then, is how to keep alive the dissensus of art without simply reducing it to the reality from which it dissents or claiming that that reality is nothing other than art.

The aesthetics section includes what is, to my mind, one of the most important of Rancière’s recent writings, the final chapter of Corcoran’s translation of Malaise dans l’esthétique (entitled Aesthetics and its Discontents in translation). “The Ethical Turn of Aesthetics and Politics” discusses the recent “ethical” orientation of both aesthetic and political thought, particularly as it appears in Lyotard’s writings on the sublime and the Holocaust as well as those who have inherited the mantle of Levinas’ ethics of the Other. In this text, Rancière details the way in which the turn to the sublime and the use of the Holocaust as a grid for political intervention remove from people their ability to act. On the political level, the claim that there just is evil in the world and that it cannot be eliminated, only alleviated, leads toward a politics of humanitarian intervention which both justifies in advance those with advanced military power and disempowers, indeed de-legitimates, movements that take place from below, movements of what Rancière calls the people or the demos. The treatment of current humanitarian and interventionist discourse in this chapter is one of the most perspicacious I have read anywhere.

Dissensus closes with a reflection Rancière offers on the trajectory of his work, detailing not only some of his own views but also reflecting on his methodological commitments, and on how they have led him to write in the sometimes elusive, sometimes ironic, manner that he does.

There are, of course, gaps in the texts of Dissensus. For instance, the distinctions between the ethical, representational, and aesthetic regimes, while glossed in Corcoran’s introduction, do not make much of an appearance in the text. However, to complain about omissions like this one is simply to note that not all of Rancière’s thought can be brought between the covers of a two-hundred page book. For those who seek to get a sense both of the richness and the breadth of the work of one of the most significant thinkers of our time, Dissensus provide a valuable resource. I can think of no better starting point than this collection.