Distant Strangers: Ethics, Psychology, and Global Poverty

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Judith Lichtenberg, Distant Strangers: Ethics, Psychology, and Global Poverty, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 276pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521124621.

Reviewed by Tina Rulli, University of California, Davis


How much can morality demand of the world's affluent and comfortable people to help the billion-plus people who live in absolute poverty? Judith Lichtenberg advances a well-worn discussion by infusing it with insights from social psychology.

On one side of the contemporary debate, ignited by Peter Singer, are those who argue that the affluent and comfortable have demanding duties to alleviate the suffering of the global poor;[1] on the other side is a program of scholarship advocating limits to the demands morality can make on individuals to help the poor.[2] Ultimately, Lichtenberg falls into the latter camp. But she aims to shift the terms of the debate.

Lichtenberg begins with two "working assumptions," seemingly in tension (7). First, those people who can do so should work to change our "morally repellent" world, where some live extremely well, while others can hardly survive. Second, morality should not demand too much of ordinary human beings. Lichtenberg's reconciliation of the two claims depends upon deontic pluralism -- the view that "should," "ought," and "responsibility" can be interpreted as moral recommendations, as well as strict obligations (52, 114).[3] People are morally recommended to help the global poor, though they are not always obligated to do so.

For Lichtenberg, people can only be obligated to do what can be reasonably expected of them. To determine what it is reasonable to expect us to do, we must understand human motivation and behavior. Lichtenberg leverages the insights of social psychological experiments, which suggest demandingness is not a "fixed quantity" (122); a demanding act can be easier for people if others from the same reference group act similarly.Bringing the two strands of thought together, if individual efforts to relieve global poverty are too demanding to generate moral obligations, they become more feasible if we can get more people to act in the same way. As such, Lichtenberg argues the traditional way of framing the issue, as one of moral obligations held by individuals, is a dead end. We should instead conceive of our responsibilities to the global poor in terms less strict than that of moral obligation and as shared by collectives.

The book has topical breadth, divided into ten chapters, which range from a critique of major normative ethical theories, support for deontic pluralism, a review of relevant social psychological literature, an empirical assessment of poverty relief efforts, a survey of views on evolutionary altruism, and an argument against psychological egoism. In covering so much, Lichtenberg leaves some of the depths unexplored. Some readers may find the theoretical premises in the book -- for example, her acceptance of deontic pluralism -- wanting, while others may crave more concrete details about the practical proposals offered. But Lichtenberg is doing the much-neglected and difficult work of integrating theoretical and practical scholarship; the focus is in where the two meet, not in the nitty-gritty of either side. Her work should be embraced as a novel roadmap for the kind of scholarship that global ethics needs -- one that is responsive to the practical wisdom of the social sciences.

In what follows, I sketch Lichtenberg's main argumentative points, followed by two concerns. Lichtenberg defends her first working assumption -- that the comfortable should work to alleviate poverty -- in Chapter 2. There are five moral reasons for positive duties to aid the poor, whether at home or abroad, based on humanitarianism, contract between parties, shared community, rectification of past or present harms, and avoiding exploitation. Lichtenberg focuses on the humanitarian reason: a person is in need and another is capable of fulfilling that need. It avoids empirical disagreement about whether the rich have harmed the poor and conceptual debates about the nature of harm.

Chapter 3 begins Lichtenberg's novel proposal for the global poverty debate. The duty to aid often takes shape in the language of rights of the global poor to receive assistance. Lichtenberg wants to defends rights-talk against the objection that it is empty rhetoric unless we identify the correlative duty holders. This constitutes her first attack on the conventional distinction between negative rights that require others' forbearance and positive rights that require others' action. As Henry Shue argues, rights should be conceived "thickly," as backed by a social guarantee.[4] This means that even conventionally conceived negative rights, such as security rights, require positive actions: governments must provide police and courts to guarantee security. Likewise, positive rights, oftentimes considered demanding in their very nature, can be fulfilled in less intensive ways by providing people opportunities to take care of themselves. Further, the thick conception of rights implicates both individuals and governmental institutions as collective duty holders. When someone has a right, we all are implicated.

Lichtenberg's full challenge to the negative/positive rights and duties distinction is realized in Chapter 4. Negative duties to abstain from causing harm are assumed to be stricter than, and to have priority over, positive duties to provide goods or assistance. This is because negative duties require that I merely stay out of your way, infringing little on my own life plans and projects, while positive duties can be very demanding. But Lichtenberg rightly notes that the New Harms of our globalized world -- those caused by pollution, climate change, and unregulated global capitalism (e.g., sweatshops) -- defy this traditional framework. New Harms arise from the aggregated, everyday actions of individuals, where no one individual is causally responsible for the harm. Avoiding contributing to New Harms can be oppressively demanding, just as positive duties to aid threaten to be. Indeed, fulfilling my negative duties with regard to New Harms may be more difficult and less efficacious than fulfilling my positive obligations. I can easily do more good by donating $100 to an effective charity than I can by abstaining from consuming $100 in fossil fuels (81). The conventional view that positive duties are less important than negative duties because they are less demanding runs aground. Lichtenberg suggests we treat our negative duties regarding New Harms and positive duties symmetrically: for each, we must do our fair share.

Thus far, Lichtenberg has built a strong case for taking our responsibilities to the global poor seriously -- we have five distinct moral reasons for doing so, the global poor have thick rights that implicate us as correlative duty holders, and the conventional view that demotes positive duties vis-à-vis negative ones is mistaken.

In Chapter 5, Lichtenberg complicates the picture, defending her second assumption: morality cannot be too demanding of ordinary human beings. Offering a much needed analysis of "Ought Implies Can," Lichtenberg persuasively proposes that morality must not only be possible for people, it must be reasonable for people. For example: some humans may be able to run a four-minute mile, demonstrating that it is possible for humans to do so. But it is not reasonable to think that just anyone can, or should. Likewise, morality must be reasonable. A reasonable account of moral responsibility should realize that as the costs to an agent of acting increase, the wrongness of not acting decreases. Lichtenberg claims that none of the major normative ethical theories can provide a plausible account of moral obligation. She ultimately advocates pluralism about the meaning of "ought." Strict obligation is limited to only those acts that can be reasonably expected of people.

Determining what it is reasonable to expect us to do requires understanding human motivation and behavior. The hope lies in Chapter 6 -- where social psychology informs moral theory. We can alter certain factors of our situation to render providing aid to others less costly to individuals. The Easterlin Paradox reveals that though richer people are, by and large, happier than poor people in a society, as that society gets richer, its people don't get happier (125). Well-being is largely relative; that is, the quantity of well-being is dependent on its relationships to others' well-being. The optimistic corollary of the Easterlin Paradox is that we could consume less, without a reduction in well-being, if others do as well. Joint sacrifices are less demanding per capita than individual ones.

The above are the core chapters in Lichtenberg's argument. In the remainder of the book, she tackles objections that plague the poverty relief debate. In Chapter 7, a novel and self-standing contribution to the literature, she responds to the common objection that placing a priority on the global poor comes at the cost of neglecting rich countries' domestic poor. She divides the poor into three comparative classes -- the very poor in poor countries, the poor in poor countries, and the poor in rich countries -- and prioritizes them based on the importance of both absolute and relative deprivations. Lichtenberg concludes that distance is relevant to moral responsibility, as the poor in affluent nations have psychological proximity to goods outside their economic reach at the detriment to their well-being. This may justify prioritizing them over the poor in poor countries.

In Chapter 8, she addresses the critics who claim that aid is ineffective or even harmful. Lichtenberg observes that hardly any such critics argue that we ought to do nothing at all. Rather, their critiques are aimed at types of aid or at the focus on aid, rather than at institutional change. Her broad argument that we ought to do something is untouched. There may be less disagreement here than Lichtenberg notes, however; as I discuss below, most of her own recommendations do not fall under a standard definition of "aid" or "assistance."

The actions and policies supported by Lichtenberg's arguments are presented in Chapter 10 (after a tangential discussion of psychological egoism, altruism, and moral motives in Chapter 9). Among other proposals, we should consider the company that we keep: if our friends are materialistic consumers, we will find it harder to limit our consumption habits. We should support policies that are attentive to the architecture of choice: using defaults that promote better results, making information vivid rather than using abstract numbers, emphasizing the aggregative effects of small contributions by many, and framing choices in ways that take advantage of our loss aversion. Lichtenberg enjoins us to: "Surf the web to find out more. Give what you can. Get greener. Make goodness a game. Tell others. Lobby decision-makers. Get together. It's not that hard" (252).

But is this enough? Throughout the work, Lichtenberg ties together two, separable theses: that we should conceive of our responsibilities to the poor as collectively held for the practical reason that this will be less demanding for each, and that only if it is less demanding, can we have strict moral obligations to them at all. I'm on board with Lichtenberg for the former thesis but have concerns about the latter.

For Lichtenberg, as the costs to the agent in acting go up, the wrongness of not acting decreases. Very demanding acts cannot be wrong to not do. Lichtenberg considers and responds to the objection that her view is confusing moral justification with excuse (115-117). In the global ethics debate, a conventional view of justifications and excuses would maintain that the world's comfortable do wrong in not doing more to end poverty, but they might be excused -- they are less than fully blameworthy -- given the material and psychological demands of doing so. But Lichtenberg's view is that the high costs of the act justify, not just excuse, abstention from the act. Justification transforms, so to speak, an otherwise wrong act to a permissible one. Lichtenberg claims excuses only make sense where it is reasonable to expect people to act a certain way, but where there are occasional, unusual conditions in which an agent might fail to act as expected. But, she says, "if the conditions that relieve people of responsibility are pervasive, if practically everyone falls short, thinking in terms of excuses makes little sense. To think this way . . . is to pathologize ordinary human psychology" (177). Such is the case with comfortable people's response to global poverty.

Lichtenberg would be hard-pressed to apply this analysis to other contexts. On pains of cultural relativism, we pronounce that people's complicity in a slave owning society was morally wrong. For all that, some of us are inclined to judge that in this case (or if you don't share the intuition in this case, you might think of another historical wrong) some such agents complicit in the moral wrong may have partial excuse for their behavior. That is, it is unequivocally wrong to support such a society, but we recognize that it took extraordinary character and was very costly to fight this well-entrenched system. Of course, one might insist in this case both that it is wrong and that complicit agents are blameworthy. But Lichtenberg's argument robs us of any middle ground that preserves the moral judgment of wrong action, while mitigating criticism of the complicit agents' characters.

One might think this analogy is unfair. Failure to donate to poverty relief is an omission, whereas supporting slavery causes harm. But Lichtenberg does not put much weight on this distinction. She might think our failure to do more for poverty relief is based in some fact about our human psychology in a way that a failure to stand up to slavery is not. But racism is as natural a feature of human psychology as any. Does denouncing complicity in a slave-owning society as wrongful pathologize ordinary human psychology?

Consider a contemporary example: many of us condemn the moral wrongs of factory farming, while, perhaps, being reluctant to blame or condemn anyone entwined in a system where it is burdensome to forgo cruelly produced animal products for cultural, economic, and other reasons. To denounce our complicity as wrong despite the costs, we are notpathologizing ordinary human psychology -- that is, we are not pronouncing it sick or abnormal. We know our reluctance to change the system arises out of normal desires, temptations, prejudices, and weaknesses. We are not sick. But we do act wrongly. If we fail to criticize human tendencies, we justify the status quo.

Thus, a reason to hold onto excuses even where the conditions that ground them are prevalent is that this allows morality to play an aspirational, guiding role in our lives. We can firmly announce certain behavior or inaction as morally wrong, even though many of us fall short of its requirements. Where Lichtenberg and I may agree is that the hope for changing these inclinations is in modifying social norms, not in moral condemnation of individuals.

This raises my second concern with Lichtenberg's argument: the efforts to bring about widespread collective action -- activism, support for political movements and revolutions -- take real dedication, time, and effort. Widespread collective change requires some individuals to become educated, to take time off work and away from family and friends to organize, to protest, to petition the government or big business, to risk, perhaps, arrest for civil disobedience. None of these undertakings is minimally demanding. While it might be true that collective action will be more efficacious, it is not at all obvious that the most efficacious collective action will be undemanding. But if it is too demanding, then, Lichtenberg says, no one can be obligated to do it. This leaves us with an anemic response to global poverty.

Lichtenberg recognizes the concern, but says little to assuage the worry (240). She proposes that we sign letters, contribute to political causes, and participate occasionally in political events. This seems hardly sufficient for an affluent or comfortable person to fulfill a responsibility to the most destitute on this planet.

The concern here is not just that her practical proposals are not efficacious or demanding enough; more alarming is that the normative underpinnings of her view -- which tether moral obligation to limits on demandingness -- take the steam out of her proposal before we get it moving. If we are not yet acting together, do I as an individual have a responsibility to get others to act together? Perhaps I do, but I am only strictly obligated to do so if it is not too demanding. The efficacy of collective action depends upon some individuals' deep dedication to creating collective movements. If neither I, nor anyone else, is obligated to bring this movement about, then those of us who will act only once Lichtenberg's ideal, collective conditions arise are moral free riders. That is, if anyone gets the movement going at all.

Still, Lichtenberg makes a valuable call to employ the insights of social psychology in better motivating desirable behavior in people to respond to global poverty. Some will want to decouple this practical wisdom from her normative theory. Regardless, Distant Strangers is an obvious choice for scholars working in global ethics, and it may generate research ideas for those working at the crossroads of moral philosophy and social psychology. Given its range and topical approach, it would be an excellent selection for an advanced undergraduate seminar on moral demands or global ethics.[5]

[1] See Peter Singer, "Famine, Affluence, and Morality," Philosophy & Public Affairs 1 (1972): 229-43; Peter Unger, Living High and Letting Die: Our Illusion of Innocence,Oxford University Press, 1996.

[2] For a selection of such views, see Garrett Cullity, The Moral Demands of Affluence, Oxford University Press, 2004; Liam B. Murphy, Moral Demands in Nonideal Theory,Oxford University Press, 2003; Samuel Scheffler, The Rejection of Consequentialism: A Philosophical Investigation of the Considerations Underlying Rival Moral Conceptions,2nd Ed., Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.

[3] The term "deontic pluralism" is attributed to Maggie Little at Lichtenberg, p. 52.

[4] Henry Shue, Basic Rights: Subsistence, Affluence, and U.S. Foreign Policy, 2nd Ed. (1996), Princeton University Press, 1980.

[5] Many thanks to Steve Campbell for his helpful comments on a draft of this review.