Distributed Cognition and the Will: Individual Cognition and Social Context

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Don Ross, David Spurrett, Harold Kincaid, and G. Lynn Stephens (eds.), Distributed Cognition and the Will: Individual Cognition and Social Context, MIT Press, 2007, 368pp., $34.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262681698.

Reviewed by Olav Gjelsvik, University of Oslo


The present collection of essays contains illuminating discussions of a range of issues around cognition, self and agency. The introduction, written by Don Ross, has the title "Science Catches the Will", and this title provides a good clue to the focal point of the collection and also to the conception of the terrain we find in many of the essays; there is something here we ought to catch, and we ought to catch it by a scientific approach. Putting things like this, we immediately invite a number of further questions, among them questions about what the will is supposed to be, what central philosophers have thought that it is, what science is, and whether science thus understood carries the right approach to the major aspects of the questions raised. That in its turn brings up general questions about the relationship between science and philosophy. While there is no doubt that good philosophy is in deep need of being informed by and fully responsive to developments in science, there is a similar requirement that scientists approaching philosophical issues be responsive to the state of the art and to the nature of the philosophical problems. There are no sharp lines between science and philosophy; the important thing is always to know what you are doing and to do it well.

There are fourteen good essays here, and the collection is an outgrowth of interaction over some time. The authors are mainly philosophers, all of them with wide interests in neighboring disciplines, many of them with research contributions of great significance in a much wider field than what is called philosophy. Some of the contributors are not professional philosophers; their work is nevertheless philosophical in nature and/or of great relevance to philosophical theorizing.

Looking back at the last fifty years of philosophy of mind and action, we see Davidson and Anscombe as very important contributors to work on and about the will at the beginning of this period. We see them engaging with questions about the will as it was conceived of by earlier philosophers, and we see both agreements and disagreement between them. The present collection starts from Davidson, and many contributors see him as someone who attempted to make room for naturalism by seeing reasons as causes, and, as one contributor, Miriam Thalos, puts it, "He sought to do justice to the idea of agency as ownership over behavior, while nonetheless preserving a basis for some semblance of a science of action" (p. 125 in her essay "The Sources of Behavior"). This idea of ownership is developed like this: "What is mine about a piece of behavior, among the scientifically minded nowadays, is the pro attitude that I direct towards it, in the form of a mental state" (p. 126).

Thalos, in her essay, builds her own position partly by contrasting her views with Davidson's. In particular, she argues against Davidson by trying to undermine what she calls his motivationalism. She presents a simple principle she sees as closely connected with Davidson's principles, and provides a counterexample to it. Her principle states that if you intend to do something, you are able to do it; if no new considerations arise, and you are not prevented from doing it, then you do it.

Of course there are counterexamples to this simple principle, and she provides one where you get lost in thought while driving away to do shopping, and arrive at your workplace instead of at the store. She foresees a Davidsonian response; that arriving at your workplace was not an intentional action. Davidson, when accounting for agency, was aiming for an account of doing something intentionally. Davidson only wants to be committed to the view that you in fact go for the act you want most if you intentionally carry out one of the acts you consider. Therefore, this counterexample to Thalos's principle might not undermine Davidson's position; he might have no reason to think her principle is true or something that is entailed by his views. Thalos holds such a reply to be "unworthy and implausible" (p. 130), since arriving at the workplace was an action in the present example.

Here, it seems to me, Davidson has a further reply that is not an implausible one. Arriving at the workplace was an action also on his account: the result of many "smaller" things we did intentionally while driving. There are on Davidson's picture many things we do in virtue of doing something else. Sometimes we do indeed intend to do A, get lost in thought, do many things intentionally, but fail to do A, and do B instead. Then doing B is an action, but not necessarily something we do intentionally; it might be an unintended result of doing many other things intentionally. It seems to me that this reply works for this case, and that Davidson avoids this particular criticism from Thalos.

There is, I think, a genuine issue about how good the Davidsonian approach is at providing understanding in cases of routine, cases where we act on "auto-pilot", but that is a different matter from the question of whether his account of agency and of doing something intentionally faces a real problem from this particular type of counterexample.

What seems to be happening throughout Thalos's extremely rich essay is that she is pursuing a theory of agency that is different in scope from that considered by Davidson, Anscombe, and others. She also pursues very many dimensions of agency, and is instructively inspired by Michael Bratman. If, however, agency is not restricted to what we do intentionally, many of the problems look very different, and so do the connections between reasons and actions in the account of agency. To illustrate: Davidson gave up giving necessary and sufficient conditions for agency because of the possibility of deviant causal chains. Thalos does not really discuss deviance, and maybe this indicates that the focus has shifted. Maybe her notion of agency does not face this problem at all, with the consequence that the climber who lets the rope go, startled by the thought that this is a possibility, acts in her sense of acting (or exhibiting agency) without intentionally letting the rope go.

Anscombe's approach to agency, by the way, also differs from Davidson's in that it exhibits no problem of deviant causal chains. Anscombe does not, however, promote an analysis of agency that depends on mental states (as they are conceived of in the present volume) towards pieces of behavior. Her approach is radically anti-Cartesian in a way Davidson's is not, and that is demonstrated by the way she starts with a worldly event, captured by the factive locution of doing something intentionally, and by the role here of non-inferential knowledge, instead of starting with pro-attitudes towards a piece of behavior, or with the thought that what makes this behavior into an action is the fact the pro-attitudes (causing it?) are of the right sort.

Phillip Pettit's excellent essay makes a contribution that is quite consistent with even an Anscombian point of view. He launches a way of thinking about the relationship between neuroscience and agency that exhibits parallels to the relationship between commonsense notions and physics. Eddington argued that modern physics showed that there were no solid objects; the obvious response is to maintain that the commonsense notion of solidity is not the notion contradicted by modern theories of the atom. The commonsensical idea of agent control need not be challenged by neuroscience, since there is no explicit commitment in common sense to the idea that "agent-control requires a history of action-production in which the formation of a consciously accessible will plays an initiating, causal role" (p. 81). I think Pettit is dead right in this. Notice, however, how close the position he thus rejects is to the position which tries to analyze agency in terms of mental attitudes towards pieces of behavior, at least when mental states are seen as they traditionally are seen: in some sense directly or transparently available to the subject. Pettit's alternative picture of agency has great appeal: we only need reasonable and accountable agents.

There might, in fact, be some tensions between the basic philosophical approaches of these contributors, Pettit and Thalos, and the tensions might be stronger than they themselves recognize them as being. Let us put this aside, and turn to some of the other individual essays.

George Ainslie's contribution is a first class presentation of the basic points about hyperbolic discounting, and of how the phenomenon of hyperbolic discounting can be made into a basic building block in a general approach to the decision making mind. The theory is presented elsewhere, yes, but this statement of it is marked by freshness and great economy. Ainslie then discusses some thought experiments, and in doing so makes a contribution towards ways of looking at both Kavka's puzzle and Newcomb's paradox. His empirical-pragmatist approach is both a strength, since it sets up things very clearly, and a possible weakness, since the solutions to the puzzle owe much to what actually happens in real life, and that is not necessarily rational. His defense of thought experiments is timely, and it is interesting that it comes from one of the contributors who is not a professional philosopher. Daniel Dennett has warned against the value of thought experiments on grounds I consider much too thin. We should avoid bad thought experiments, but the existence of those should not deprive us of an important and valuable philosophical tool, a refinement of our general reasoning capacity.

Dennett's own paper contains an interesting discussion of an idea of David McFarland, that "Communication is the only behavior that requires an organism to self-monitor its own control system". If self-monitoring is the source of what it is like to be something, then perhaps only communicators have minds that control behavior in agency. "The bat's body has a mind of its own, and does not need a "me" to inhabit it at all" (p. 98).

Andy Clark's essay, "Soft Selves and Ecological Control", is a critical and careful investigation into what sort of thing such a "me" might be, and argues in favor of a soft self approach, i.e. an approach where it is denied that there is a self in the sense of some central cognitive essence that makes me who and what I am. This does of course lead to several problems. Clark ably discusses some of these. We might still be somewhat uneasy about the general approach: "For many social and legal purposes, it is convenient to simply identify the agent with the core biological ensemble. We imprison the body and brain, not the laptop!" (p. 114). Clark faces some of the challenges for a position which gives up on what he calls a "hard central self", and works his way towards some sort of compromise position. I am a little bit worried though, about the remark about imprisonment. There need not be a hard central self in his sense of that term, but there seems to be a need for a moral centrality, in the form of a range of basic moral and normative insights on behalf of a self-governing agent that makes up a background for the accountable self in Pettit's sense, and it is hard to catch hold of this in Clark's present, much improved picture. But I may be wrong about this.

The five essays I have focused upon make up the centre of the book in a physical sense, and as I see it, also in an intellectual sense. But this might be a reflection of my own biases.

Don Ross's nice introductory essay gives a good and illuminating introduction to the issues in the book, and a precise characterization of the various contributions it contains. Ross sees many connections that cannot be brought up in this review, and the essay is highly recommended even if one does not read the whole book. The essay by Daniel Wegner and Betsy Sparrow deals with coaction. This is well written and much fun. In their view coaction includes very many different things, and it is not clear that it really amounts to a category in need of a unified treatment. The contributions by Paul Sheldon Davies and Tamler Sommers are good and competent treatments of aspects of agency from a thoroughly naturalist standpoint. Sommers makes the claim that an evolutionary approach to freedom found in Dennett can be recast as the evolution of the illusion of freedom, and that thinking of freedom as just an illusion is not that problematic. Davies is very critical towards the more commonsensical concepts we employ to understand agency. Both essays are clear and well written.

The last five essays also form a group, and Don Ross's long and instructive essay on "The Economic and Evolutionary Basis of Selves" is the first. It discusses several important topics of great relevance for understanding social dynamics, and aspects of what might be thought of as collective intentionality. The discussion of what he calls game determination is distinctive and instructive; it reflects on the fact that most social agents do not, when they encounter each other, know enough about each other's utility function to know which game is being played. This has great significance for institutions and the function of some types of narratives that uphold views of who we are. "Selves are sculpted into being by social processes" (p. 219).

The essays by Lawrence Lengbeyer on "Situated Cognition", and Wayne Christensen on the "Evolutionary Origins of Volition", both contain a lot of material for thought and theorizing. Jeffrey Vancouver and Tadeusz Zawidszki's essay provides an interesting and challenging defense of the importance of control theory as this is now developing in psychology. The whole book is rounded off by Dan Lloyd's immensely readable essay on "Civil Schizophrenia". There are many connections between the work done in these essays and what is going on in the rest of the book. There is a great need to think through the significance of new findings about what goes on in decision-making but is not available to the consciousness of the decision-making agent. We would do well to get started  on this project. These later essays also stand much on their own with all the material they present. I think that some of this material lends itself, as Lloyd’s essay makes clear, to theorizing that might fit into importantly different philosophical approaches.

All in all, this is an extremely rich collection, with many threads, and while some of the cognition might be quite distributed, there is a pronounced will for unity that gives the book a cohesive self of the soft sort we are all able to recognize after reading and interacting with it.[1]

[1] I am very grateful to Jennifer Hornsby for comments on a draft of this review.