Distributive Justice: Getting What We Deserve from Our Country

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Fred Feldman, Distributive Justice: Getting What We Deserve from Our Country, Oxford University Press, 2016, 269pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198782988.

Reviewed by James Alexander, Bilkent University


Following Rawls's 'Justice as Fairness' and Brian Barry's 'Justice as Impartiality', this book should probably be entitled 'Justice as Desert'. For here is the classic account of justice all over again: one which was expressed in the words suum cuique, literally 'to each his own', or, more fully, 'the rendering to each man his due' -- a view which, according to Plato, originated with Simonides. It is the view found in Cicero and Justinian's Institutes. Lawyers like it. Philosophers, following Plato, do not. Andrew Vincent in The Nature of Political Theory points out that theories of justice in the last half century have been theories of anything but desert. So it is interesting to find a modern philosopher defending it.

Feldman tries to theorise distributive justice in terms of desert. His theory is short and he expresses in a single sentence. It is:

there is perfect political economic distributive justice in a society if and only if in every case in which a member deserves a political economic desert in virtue of his or her possession of a political economic desert base, the community ensures that he or she receives that desert. (p. 2)

The terminology is a bit awkward. A better writer would have used the verb 'deserve' in preference to the noun 'desert', and would certainly have avoided 'desert base' (which for a while made me think of Iraq). When it is first defined on p. 36 he calls it a 'desert basis', and means by it whatever makes a deserver deserve a desert from the 'appropriate distributor' of deserts. Feldman's book is, in large part, an attempt to get the reader used to using the language of desert when thinking about problems of justice.

I read the book three times. Each time I had a different response. The first time I thought the book was all about the desert argument, hence a typical analytical book, fairly worthy, exact and thorough. Feldman interestingly appeared to be a pre-Rawlsian political philosopher. The second time I noticed that he was putting forward two arguments, not just the one stated above. Now his book seemed rather less transparent than before, perhaps more controversial, and flawed. Feldman now seemed to be not only a pre-Rawlsian, but some sort of neo-Aristotelian. The third time I saw what Feldman had left out. He had ignored both the contemporary objections to theories of desert from within normative political philosophy and also the sorts of major questions which might occur to someone more broadly interested in history and politics, or even in the fate of liberalism in political philosophy. The book will be of most interest to those who only read it once.

Much of the book is a meditation upon the single sentence theory, and on rival theories which, Feldman suggests, are best seen for what they are when they are expressed in a similar sentence. In this regard, the book is supposed to be a contribution to clarity of argument. Certainly, there are sections, especially in chapters 2 and 3, which are of genuine service to anyone interested in defining justice in terms of desert. Far more writing in political philosophy should attempt the level of argumentative clarity found here. Feldman does fairly reasonably expose different positions. For philosophers who like 'argumentation' this will be grist to their mill. Since I think 'argumentation' is often rather rhetorical (i.e., 'I shall state my thesis briefly, then patiently rehearse objections to it at great length, then bluntly restate it, then puzzle about why anyone would continue to object to it'), I eventually found it a bit laborious.

Some of the comparisons are interesting. In chapter 3 he offers a typology of types of desert. This is where he formulates each view of desert in a sentence so the contrast with his own theory can be seen clearly. There is 'cosmic desert', by which 'there is perfect distributive justice in a society if and only if every member of that society receives everything that he or she deserves' (p. 59). This is too grandiose for Feldman. So there is 'divine desert', by which there is perfect distributive justice if God gives everyone in the afterlife what they deserve according to what they have done in their life (p. 65). Feldman mentions this, then moves on. But he lingers long enough to notice the similarity between this form of justice and the one which Rawls criticised in Theory of Justice. This was 'earthly moral desert' by which there is perfect distributive justice if a government gives everyone what they deserve by way of happiness according to how they have behaved morally (p. 67). Feldman observes that Rawls was dismissive of this. So he abandons moral desert and instead -- in the move which is the key to this book -- advocates his own 'political economic desert'.

Feldman is of course writing in the long wake of the resurgence of interest in justice since Rawls's Theory of Justice in 1971. A standard history of political philosophy goes like this. First, political philosophy before 1971 was boring, very abstract, concerned with definitions (bad). Then, in 1971 Rawls made it relevant to practice (good), though he did so by eliminating politics and seeing everything in ethical terms (bad). Finally, since 1971, political philosophers have realised that political philosophy should deal with politics (good). This standard history in three stages is now told everywhere. (One reason is that it is actually a history of Rawls. There were three Rawlses, if one ignores the original Christian Rawls. The first was a philosopher, eager to characterise justice. The second was someone trying to design a substantive state of affairs based on a position in moral philosophy. The third was someone trying to adjust this design so it was 'political, not metaphysical'.) It is a very self-serving history. If you believe it, then you are probably using it to justify your own philosophical activity somewhere along its line. I think there are better histories. But no matter. For here this story enables us to locate Feldman's theory of justice as desert.

Feldman, unlike almost everyone else, is, on this side at least, committed to a style which most resembles Rawls's original style of the 1950s. He declares: 'I think that a theory of distributive justice tells us what makes the situation in some state distributively just . . . It should leave out any discussion of what we should do, or how things should be' (p. 16). So compared to Rawls's project, his 'is the more purely philosophical project of articulating a conception of distributive justice that is true' (p. 198). This enables him to refuse to engage with the many contemporary political theorists who have been taught by Rawls, Walzer, Sandel, G. A. Cohen, Sen et al. to think that justice matters in the real world. I am, for one, sympathetic to the attempt to characterise justice again in terms of desert. But insofar as this is what Feldman is doing he is ignoring the momentum of the entire debate. Yet there is a caveat. For Feldman, at the cost of damaging his pose as a purist, does have a second side to his theory which points it in a very different, rather more engaged, direction.

Feldman lays such explicit emphasis on his theory of desert that it is possible to miss the fact that there is another theory running alongside it.

Let me state the two separate arguments so they are clear. First, Feldman says, in effect: 'We deserve things from a government that only a government can supply, if such a government exists as I have defined it.' Fair enough, for this is a circular definition. If a government is defined as an entity which supplies us with what we deserve and what we cannot supply for ourselves individually, then why not? There is nothing wrong with this, though it is invertebrate, a mere abstraction, a circle of artificial design.

Then, perhaps because he recognises this, though he does not say so, Feldman adds another argument which can do something in the world. This wholly overturns his claim to be doing nothing more than characterising justice. He says, in effect: 'We deserve things from a government that only a government can supply, therefore we must have a government as I have defined it'. The way he makes this argument work is, perhaps rather surprisingly, by appealing to both Aristotle and Hobbes. Justice is no longer simply 'x', to be understood a certain way wherever it exists. Rather, justice is a 'y' which we must have, for the sake of something else we need, 'z'. This 'z', from one point of view (Hobbes's) is avoidance of injury (p. 80). But Feldman is more interested in another point of view (Aristotle's), from which it is 'flourishing' (p. 76). In effect he says: 'We all want to flourish, flourishing requires justice, so we all require justice, and so we must have a government which supplies us with what we deserve when we cannot supply it ourselves.'

Is this not wonderful? Feldman starts as an old-fashioned philosopher, defining justice in a neat circular manner, but then silently suffers a Damascene revelation, an Aristotelian moment, when the lights go on and suddenly he has a justification for insisting that we deserve to have everything we deserve given to us by our governments. Despite the pomp of his utterances about being more philosophical than Rawls, he too can offer us a rival to those countless normative philosophical sketches of a just order à la Rawls: which, in his case, is a sort of welfare-state, insurance-state version of Aristotle's polis, though adjusted in accordance with everyone's individual 'desert base'. At times it looks as if Feldman wants to reconcile the liberty of the ancients and the moderns: 'I think it is reasonable to maintain that human flourishing involves having the opportunity to participate in the decisions of one's government' (p. 99) But this is only possible because there are two Feldmans, from two different worlds: one from the desert, so to speak, the other from the garden of plenty.

This two-sided theory replicates in its own way what I think is a fundamental problem in all of the modern literature about justice. It seems to me that two different meanings of justice are spoken about at once. One is the view of Simonides that justice is the rendering of dues or repayment of debts. By this definition, a just man is a requiter. The other is the Socratic view that justice is the sum of all political virtues. By this definition, a just man is a good man, something more than a requiter. These are clearly entirely different conceptions:

Firstly, I give you what you deserve because I am just in a mundane sense, requiting good for good, evil for evil, indifferent for indifferent, always reciprocal. My justice comes out of a balancing scale, my eyes are bound.

Secondly, I give you more than you deserve because I am just in some higher sense, requiting good for good, evil and indifferent, always benevolent. I am just in the sense of good. My justice is a surplus, a bounty as boundless as the sea, my eyes are open.

I think the entire literature since Rawls is in two minds about justice, treating it at once as if it is adequate requital (individualistic and non-comparative, to use the modern phrases) and also as if it is a vision of the contemporary political good though in an admittedly pretty watery form (holistic and comparative). Feldman, despite his own self-denying ordinance, runs continually from one to the other. Is there not a vast sleight of hand behind all this modern talk of justice? Is it really the case that we can generate a theory of the good or even goods out of a theory of adequate requital?

The fundamental objection to Feldman's theory is that it assumes that we humans begin in credit. We are thrown into Feldman's world neither as Plato's furless, toothless and clawless creatures, badly in need of Prometheus's gift of fire and Zeus's gift of politics, nor as Heidegger's existentially exposed instances of Dasein, badly in need of home and Hölderlin. We arrive in Feldman's version of the world as well-insured citizens -- citizens prior to any state -- with something in the bank to draw upon in an emergency. But no God supplies this credit. Instead the philosopher, by sheer normative exertion, produces a bit of creative accounting to show that we all come into the world in a state of ontological credit. Plus there is a bit of rosy Aristotelian colouring. Feldman postulates the existence of an 'appropriate political economic distributor' to give us what we deserve (p. 71). But a more realistic view would surely be that states are inappropriate political economic distributors. States have characteristics which prevent them being appropriate ones, such as the irrelevance, inadvertence and ambition evident in all political activity, not to mention exploitation, neglect and sanction of violence. Surely libido dominandi is not a very steady 'base' for ensuring that duties be done or deserts be requited?

Seen this way, the book is just another flickering out of the Rawlsian flame, an after-effect of a dying tradition. It looks like an anti-Rawlsian theory, but one strangely eager to be compatible with Rawls, and one which even more strangely has unaccountable Aristotelian elements in it.

Let us leave aside the objection that there may be something fundamentally wrong with all modern theories of justice. For Feldman is engaged in what even contemporary normative philosophers would consider a highly idiosyncratic enterprise, and for reasons he is not entirely clear about. He ignores the challenge of the following view: 'The idea that economic benefits may justly be assigned on the basis of an individualistic standard of desert has, quite simply, ceased to be tenable'. (Samuel Scheffler, Boundaries and Allegiances: Problems of Justice and Responsibility in Liberal Thought, Oxford, 2001, p. 192). For most contemporary political philosophers, desert can only be used in relation to retributive or commutative justice, and not in relation to distributive justice. So a theory of justice as desert might at most cover Hobbesian 'injury' but not Aristotelian 'flourishing'. For most political philosophers, distributive justice has to apply holistically not individualistically: it has to be systematic, it has to trade with the unencumbered self. It is therefore not a matter of desert. Even though Feldman comes from an older tradition, and possibly even, in part, a more sensible one (when he remains in his 1950s mood), the onus is on him -- if he wants to convert contemporary political philosophers to his position -- to explain why this standard claim is wrong. I can see the subject from both sides, since I see it from neither side. But since Feldman sees it from one side only, he must deal with the counter-argument. Scheffler and others like Peter Steinberger have worried about the problem, which is perhaps why they have never offered a full theory of justice as desert, though they have thought theories of justice have not done enough to incorporate desert, if it is compatible with justice, or explain why it has to be ignored, if it is antithetical to it. Whereas Feldman seems to think that it is enough to point (in the conclusion of chapter 7) to the fact that Rawls would not find anything in Feldman's theory to which he would object.

It is impossible to avoid amusement and exasperation at this, and not only because Rawls is still the bald eagle authority figure of American political philosophy. Of course Rawls would object to Feldman's theory! Rawls's theory of distributive justice was a theory of justice for everyone-at-once and not a theory of justice for each-according-to-his-or-hers. I cannot help thinking there is something political behind Feldman's determined effort to theorise distributive justice in terms of what encumbered selves might deserve, but he does not say what it is. As I say, his theory is both more individualistic than Rawls's and more political in the sense of the polis -- which is odd, to say the least. It is not obvious to me, without a lot more explanation, that the political theories of Hobbes and Aristotle can be reconciled in one sentence about 'desert'.

The argument is that there is no 'desert' without a 'desert base'. But what Feldman seems to be silent about is the fact that there is no 'desert base' without (to adopt the style) a 'desert base world', that is, 'features in virtue of which a distributor is able and willing to consider that a deserver deserves his deserts from the distributor in virtue of possessing a desert base'. The reason Feldman stops where he does is, I assume, because his theory suddenly encounters a chasm. He silently relies on the sort of Stoic impersonally universalistic theory which Frank Ankersmit (Aesthetic Politics) and Charles Taylor (A Secular Age) have put to the question. There is nothing sublime, nothing holy, nothing transcendent, nothing scandalous, nothing troublesome in his theory: everything is just in the assured and insulated vein of modern immanentism. He flows on a tide of attenuated natural law. It is very odd. The more I think about this book the odder it seems. It is almost as if Feldman is trying to distract the reader with argument. But the sleight of hand is so effective one wonders if it has bewildered the trickster, who tries to hide the fact that something is going wrong by pulling more argumentation out of his sleeve.