Divine Action and Modern Science

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Saunders, Nicholas, Divine Action and Modern Science, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 234pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521524164.

Reviewed by Thomas Tracy , Bates College


The last twenty years have seen a remarkable renewal of interest in the relation of religion and science. One particularly difficult tangle of issues has to do with the idea, deeply rooted in the theistic traditions, that God acts in the world. What is the relation between theological depictions of the world as the scene of divine action and scientific descriptions of the world as an intelligible structure of natural law? Can God be understood to act entirely in and through the regular structures of nature or does a robust account of divine action also require the affirmation that God acts to redirect the course of events in the world, bringing about effects that would not have occurred had God not so acted? If we say the latter, are we committed to the claim that God at least sometimes performs miracles, in the familiar (if truncated) modern sense of an event caused by God that “violates” the laws of nature?

Saunders begins by noting the Biblical roots and theological prominence of the idea of divine action in the world. For the writers of the Hebrew Bible there was no notion of nature as an autonomous system and God as an external agent; rather the world around us is an expression of God’s vital activity and purposes. This Biblical talk of divine action poses problems for modern interpreters, however, as was evident in the embarrassing predicament of the Biblical Theology movement of the 1950’s, which proclaimed that God is made known through mighty acts in history, and yet which was unable to give a satisfactory account of what God has done. The difficulty for modern theologians centers on the idea of particular, or special, divine action. Special divine action is often contrasted to God’s general action of creating and sustaining the universe as a whole. If we say that God’s purposes are realized entirely through the natural order that God creates, then there need be no conflict with what the sciences tell us about the law-governed processes constituting that natural order. Special divine action, however, involves bringing about “genuine physical effects that would not have occurred had God not chosen to act” (p. 21). This appears to require that God intervene within the natural order to turn events in a direction they would not otherwise have gone.

Modern theologians have notoriously grown wary of miracles, understood as divine acts that contravene the laws of nature. There are many reasons for this: some are distinctively theological (e.g., concerns about God’s consistency in creation), but others reflect responses to the methods and findings of the natural sciences, and especially to modern conceptions of the integrity of natural law. Saunders gives particular attention to the latter, surveying a number of philosophical analyses of the concept of a “law of nature,” and focusing especially on “necessitarian” accounts, which are presupposed in debates about determinism. He borrows from William James a working definition of determinism according to which it claims (quoting James) that “those parts of the universe already laid down absolutely appoint and decree what the other parts shall be” (Saunders, p. 85). It appears that in a deterministic universe special divine action would have to take the form of a miraculous intervention in the order of nature. If, however, the structures of nature are indeterministic, it may be possible for God to bring about particular effects in the world without contravening natural law precisely because those laws do not in every case fully specify each succeeding state. This would be a form of non-interventionist special divine action.

There currently are two leading options for developing a position of this kind. Each relies upon the interpretation of a contemporary scientific theory, quantum mechanics in one case and chaos theory in the other. A critique of these proposals is the heart of Saunders’s book, and he opens these chapters with an historical survey of the theological uses of quantum mechanics. The best known early proponent of this approach is William Pollard in Chance and Providence (London: Farber and Farber, 1958), but a number of thinkers have explored variants of this idea in the last decade (see, e.g., the essays collected in Robert John Russell, Philip Clayton, Kirk Wegter-McNelly, John Polkinghorne, eds., Quantum Mechanics: Scientific Perspectives on Divine Action [Vatican Observatory Publications and Center for Theology and the Natural Sciences, 2001]). Saunders argues that this general approach faces a number of important objections, and he is surely right about this. His critique is marred, however, by understating the extent to which most of these objections have been recognized and considered in recent discussions by the authors he cites. He contends, for example, that these accounts “all claim ’quantum events’ as a locus of SDA [special divine action] and yet do not explain how this might be the case, or even what they take to be an ’event’ in quantum mechanics” (p. 129). In fact, most of the authors he considers make it clear that they are talking about so-called “measurement events” in which (according to a widely held version of the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum theory) the wave function describing the probabilistic properties of a quantum entity (e.g., an electron) collapses non-deterministically to a single value for the “measured” (i.e., irreversibly registered) property.

Nonetheless, Saunders’s analysis of the issues is perceptive and helpful, not least because it is informed by a detailed grasp of the relevant science. He points out that quantum systems evolve deterministically according to the Schrödinger equation, and that the only point of possible indeterminism is in probabilistic state reduction, as we just noted. Further, we can conclude that the unpredictability of the outcome of this event reflects ontological indeterminism, rather than merely epistemic uncertainty, only if we adopt a particular interpretive approach to quantum theory. This interpretation takes the probabilistic character of the quantum formalism to reflect a superposition of properties in the quantum system, and it holds that the collapse of this superposition has necessary but not sufficient conditions in the history of the system and its environment. Although views of this kind dominate current discussion, there are well-developed deterministic alternatives, (for example, the pilot wave hypothesis developed by David Bohm, and some forms of the “many worlds” interpretation).

Saunders argues that even if we adopt a version of the “orthodox” indeterministic interpretation, there is little prospect of successfully developing an account of special divine action at the quantum level. He identifies four possible ways in which, given this interpretation of quantum mechanics, God could act upon a quantum system. 1) God might alter the wavefunction between measurements; 2) God might make a measurement on a system; 3) God might alter the probabilities for realizing particular outcomes; 4) God might determine the outcome of measurement. Saunders considers and rejects each of these alternatives, though it is clear that only the fourth is relevant to the project of conceiving of special divine action in a way that does not contravene the order of nature. His formulation of this fourth option is curious. “The final approach to quantum SDA in the ’orthodox’ interpretation of quantum measurement is the assertion that God simply ’ignores’ the probabilities predicted by the orthodox measurement theory and controls the outcomes of particular measurements” (p. 154). A theologian interested in non-interventionist special divine action will not say that God ignores the probability distributions predicted by quantum theory. Rather, the thesis would be that God might act in the world by determining quantum events within the ordinary probability patterns, which do, after all, permit wide variation in particular outcomes from instance to instance. If some of these quantum events were located within natural structures that amplify them in such a way that they have significant consequences on the macroscopic level, then God could affect the larger course of events without contravening any statistical or deterministic laws of nature.

Clearly, a proposal of this sort is highly speculative and intimately tied to some of the most unsettled and unsettling puzzles in the interpretation of quantum theory. The question about the amplification of quantum events, for example, is crucial; if indeterministic quantum chance is entirely subsumed within higher level deterministic regularities, then it will be of no use to the theologian looking for a means of non-interventionist special divine action. Saunders does not press this point, however. Rather, he argues that if God were to determine quantum events, then the probability patterns “either are a deception in that they have no relationship with physical reality whatsoever, or they are a representation of the chance of God acting in the same way on a subsequent occasion. Both of these conclusions are unsatisfactory…” (p. 155). The first half of this dilemma is easily dispelled. If God chooses to determine events that the causal structures of nature leave undetermined, there is no divine deception involved; quantum systems really do display these stochastic regularities, and the fact that God establishes them through direct divine action no more undercuts their standing as physical fact than if they were determined by a (non-local) hidden variable (as in Bohm’s theory). Saunders argues for the unacceptability of the second alternative in this dilemma by contending that if we treat quantum-measurement probabilities as reflecting regularities in divine action, then this commits us to a “regularitarian,” or neo-Humean, conception of natural laws. This is incompatible with the idea that a divine act could violate a law of nature, and therefore the very distinction between interventionist and non-interventionist divine action collapses. Each of the links in this argument is problematic; it is not clear how the theological view in question entails a general commitment to a regularitarian conception of natural law or why such a view would make it impossible to speak of violations of natural law (understood, following Hume in his essay on miracles, as events that fall outside well-evidenced patterns of constant conjunction). Nor is it clear why, if the argument were successful, a theologian concerned with special divine action should be troubled by this result, since the worry about law-violating interventions would then disappear. This is not to deny that there are a number of important problems facing the suggestion that God might act to determine some or all undetermined transitions at the quantum level; as we have seen, there are uncertainties of interpretation in quantum mechanics, fundamental puzzles associated with measurement and wavefunction collapse in contemporary varieties of the Copenhagen interpretation, and open questions about the amplification of quantum events. (There are also, of course, important theological misgivings that can be raised about this mode of divine action.) Saunders skillfully analyzes the scientific issues, but his discussion does not justify the conclusion that “non-interventionist quantum SDA is not theoretically possible” (p. 172).

A second approach to non-interventionist special divine action appeals to chaos theory, and is especially associated with the work of John Polkinghorne. Saunders’s discussion of mathematical chaos theory is technically sophisticated and illuminating. He gives particular attention to Edward Lorenz’s attempt to model the behavior of the atmosphere, which led to the discovery that his mathematical model displayed an extraordinarily sensitive dependence on the precise specification of initial conditions. Vanishingly small differences in initial conditions result in dramatically different states of the system on very short time scales. As a result, even though the non-linear mathematical equations describing the system develop deterministically, its future behavior is unpredictable for any finite intelligence. We can, however, recognize an overall pattern in the ensemble of possible paths of development (the “phase space”) marked out by a chaotic system. In dissipative systems, in which energy is lost over time, trajectories through the phase space will tend to contract and converge, generating a pattern known as an attractor. In so-called “strange attractors” the converging paths fold in on themselves so tightly that there is, at the limit, no energy difference between them, though they do not cross or join.

Does chaos theory provide a set of concepts useful to the theologian interested in non-interventionist special divine action in the world? The immediate answer would appear to be that it does not. The unpredictability of chaotic systems is generated out of a smoothly deterministic mathematics, and so does not provide the causal openness that special divine action appears to require. Precisely this point has often been made in response to John Polkinghorne’s appeals to chaos theory in his accounts of divine action. Saunders argues that this criticism of Polkinghorne misses the broader metaphysical thesis at work in Polkinghorne’s proposal, though Saunder’s own quite careful and effective criticism of Polkinghorne’s position also relies on noting the deterministic character of chaos theory. Polkinghorne holds that the surprising emergence of unpredictability in the midst of classical determinism provides the motivation for a metaphysical conjecture: namely, that the deterministic character of our understanding of chaotic systems is an artifact of our theory making, with its simplification and abstraction, and not a feature of the structures in the world that we are attempting to describe. Those structures are more supple, flexible, and sensitively interrelated than our theory can yet capture. Saunders goes on to show, however, that Polkinghorne’s account of divine action relies on aspects of chaos theory that arise precisely by virtue of its deterministic mathematics. “The only reason that sensitive dependence and strange attractors exist is precisely because the mathematics of chaos theory are deterministic” (p. 192). Polkinghorne suggests that God acts not by “tweaking” the initial conditions of chaotic systems but rather through a non-energetic input of “active information” that selects among nearby paths through the phase space of the system. Saunders replies that “active information input relies again on the determinism of mathematical chaos to produce the required fractal structure in attractors, the required infinite limit of that structure, and the corresponding region in which energy differences between alternative possible trajectories tends to zero” (p. 194). The dependence of Polkinghorne’s account upon properties of chaotic systems that arise only within a deterministic mathematics crucially undercuts his metaphysical conjecture that the actual structures modeled by this theory are indeterministic.

At the end of the book, Saunders turns briefly to the views of Arthur Peacocke, whose approach provides an interesting contrast to those considered so far. He too thinks it important to affirm that God acts to affect the ongoing course of events in the world. But he denies that God does so by exploiting causal incompleteness in the structure of natural processes; indeed, he regards any divine action inserted among natural causes (whether it interrupts a natural causal chain or occurs at a point of natural indeterminism) as an “intervention.” Instead, Peacocke contends that God acts by means of “whole-part,” or “top-down” constraints upon the world-as-a-whole. Nature, he notes, is organized as a hierarchy of increasingly complex systems in which lower level structures support and are incorporated within higher levels of organization. Peacocke, as a panentheist, holds that this entire structure is incorporated within the being of God, though God is not simply identical with the world. God, then, can be thought of as the highest level system-of-all-systems that embraces all the structures of nature, and God can be understood to act not as a “triggering cause” at lower levels of the system but rather as a “structuring cause” at the highest level. That is, God affects the operation of the world system in the way higher level organizational properties of a whole constrain the operation of the parts.

Saunders finds Peacocke’s position to be “the most promising current theory of SDA” (p. 213), though he acknowledges that it operates at a high level of abstraction. Following on the heels of Saunders’s detailed critical analysis of theological appeals to quantum mechanics and chaos theory, his brief discussion of Peacocke is something of an anti-climax. Peacocke’s proposal is subtle and appealing, but there clearly are critical questions that need to be raised about it. It is not apparent, for example, how Peacocke’s God could bring about particular changes in the course of events by acting as a structural constraint on the system as a whole. If God is to affect the structure of the system, then God must modify the relation of its parts, and this requires that God act upon the parts in a way that will show up in their causal history; it appears that divine action among natural causes cannot be avoided after all.

Saunders’s discussion is rich in helpful detail. His command of the relevant science allows him to fill in crucial background information and clear away misunderstandings. The result is a valuable volume that contributes significantly to focusing and deepening the engagement of theology with the natural sciences.