Divine Contradiction

Divine Contradiction

Jc Beall, Divine Contradiction, Oxford University Press, 2023, 176pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192845436.

Reviewed by Daniel Molto, University of Sussex


Theories that posit truth-value gluts are now a well-established part of the philosophical landscape. The issue of whether any contradiction can be true has hardly been settled to everyone’s satisfaction, but the debate has now moved on to applications. Where, if anywhere, in the universe are contradictions to be met with? One obvious place to look for so extraordinary a phenomenon as a true contradiction is in theology. In his latest offering, Divine Contradiction, Jc Beall does just that.

This book follows on from his 2021 book, The Contradictory Christ, which focused on the Christian doctrine of the Incarnation. In Divine Contradiction, Beall applies the glutty treatment to the doctrine of the Trinity (the doctrine according to which there are three distinct persons who are God, but there is exactly one God).

The Big Picture

For the source of the orthodox Christian doctrine of the Trinity, Beall turns to the 8th century text commonly called ‘The Athanasian Creed,’[1] of which he thinks the following are the key passages:

1. we venerate one God in trinity, and trinity in unity;

2. neither confounding the persons nor dividing the substance.

3. For there is one person of the Father, another of the Son, and another of the Holy Spirit;

4. the Father is God, the Son is God, and the Holy Spirit is God;

5. and yet they are not three gods, but one god (viz., God) (interpreted by Philip Neri Reese, O.P, Beall 2023: 123).

Beall thinks that a charitable reading is “simple and flat-footed” in its interpretation of these passages. Such an interpretation, according to Beall, gives us the following theological axioms.

A1. Non-identity: the divine persons are pairwise distinct. (i.e., non-identical). [From 2 above]

A2. Identity: each divine person is (identical to) God. [From 4 above]

A3. Positive Uniqueness: the number of gods is 1 (viz., God) (Beall 2023: 24).

Broadly, the goal of the book is to show that the best account of how A1–A3 might jointly be true is one which involves contradictions in divine reality. More specifically:

The simple thesis advanced in this book is that trinitarian identity is non-transitive in virtue of contradictions true of divine reality—in virtue of divine contradiction, contradictions arising not just from Christ’s contradictory being but also from differences among the persons each of whom is identical to God. That’s the main thesis (Beall 2023: 28).

The rejection of the transitivity of the identity relation involved in A2 further serves to set Beall’s account apart from existing attempts to solve the logical problem of the Trinity. A question immediately strikes the reader: why allow both gluts and non-transitive identity? Aren’t either one of these options sufficient on their own to provide a solution?

The answer is important for understanding Beall’s proposal. First, Beall thinks the existence of divine contradictions provides the best explanation for why the Trinitarian identity relation is non-transitive. But why should a glutty account of the Trinity need to posit non-transitive identity relations? That is because of where the divine contradictions lie. Beall does not think that the divine contradiction is the conjunction of these:

A. It is false that the Father is the Son.

B. The Father is the Son.

If this were the Trinitarian contradiction, then indeed transitivity could be maintained. But the theological cost of locating the contradiction here is too high. In particular, B is not theologically acceptable, even in the context of a glutty theology. Beall intends for his account to have the result that (at least some) heretical statements are just false, not true and false. Instead, Beall locates the contradiction here:

C. The Father is God.

D. It is false that the Father is God.

Importantly, Beall does not think that D is heretical, when it is accompanied by C.

So, on Beall’s account, B is just false, but C is true, as is

E. The Son is God.

Beall thinks that a “flatfooted” interpretation of the Athanasian creed requires that the ‘is’ in B, C, and E in each case expresses unambiguously the same relation of identity. It is therefore a consequence of B’s (just) falsity and the truth of C and E, that this one relation of identity must be non-transitive.

The Details

So much for the big picture. But this of course is a work of (applied) logic, and the details are important. Beall holds that the logical system known as “First-Degree Entailment” (FDE) is the correct account of logical entailment. FDE is a weak system on which both explosion:

A ʌ ¬A ؞ B

and excluded middle:

B ؞ A v ¬A

are invalid. Given the former, it is a paraconsistent logic. Moreover, as a glut-friendly logic, detachment:

A, A→B ؞ B

also fails. This is because A→B is true in a situation where A is true and false and B is just false. In such a case, both premises are true, but the conclusion is just false.

One notable absence from the logical system is a relation of identity. Indeed, a background assumption of the book is the increasingly popular thesis that there are different relations of identity, and that none of them is a “logical relation”. This does not of course mean that the concept of identity is entirely up for grabs. All relations of (numerical) identity still have some common content. Beall uses the metaphor “same recipe, different ingredients” with regard to the plurality of identity relations. As we have seen, his account of the Trinity depends on his contention that one of these relations is non-transitive.

The general concept, or “recipe”, for identity that Beall offers looks on the face of it to be fairly traditional:

(Definition 3.3.1) Where φ ranges over the set of T’s (non-identity) predicates

• t ~ t′ is true according to T iff every instance of φ(t) ⇔ φ(t′) is true according to T;

• t ~ t′ is false according to T iff some instance of φ(t) ⇔ φ(t′) is false according to T (52),

where t and t’ are any singular terms in the language of theory T and ~ is the defined relation (i.e., identity). The relation ⇔ is undefined, though it is part of the recipe that it be read as some form of biconditional.

The “ingredients” are the theory-specific notions by which we precisify the content of Definition 3.3.1 relative to a particular theory. Most notably, one of the ingredients is the biconditional relation by which the unspecified relation ⇔ is interpreted. The particular ingredient that Beall uses here to prepare his specific Trinitarian identity relation is just the FDE material conditional, →.

This choice of ingredient is significant because → is a relation for which detachment fails. Thus, although it is true of the general concept of identity that if t ~ t′, then φ(t) ⇔ φ(t′), this does not mean that it is part of the general concept of identity that the following entailment pattern holds:

Substitution: t ~ t′, φ(t) ⊢ φ(t′)

This is because, although from t ~ t′ , we might be able to infer φ(t) ⇔ φ(t′), we cannot get from that and φ(t) to φ(t′) if the biconditional relation precisifying φ(t) ⇔ φ(t′) is one that does not support detachment.

Now, although Substitution fails in general as an entailment pattern, our theoretical commitments might supply us with other, weaker, patterns that can allow us to make some deductions from identity statements. Beall offers us the following two entailment patterns which he thinks do hold for his Trinitarian identity relation. Where f stands for the Father, s stands for the Son, h stands for the Holy Spirit, g stands for God and ⊢θ is the semantic entailment relation for Beall’s Trinitarian theory, which includes the claims that each of f, s and h are identical with g, then:

T+: φ(f) v φ(s) v φ(h) ⊣ ⊢θ φ(g),


T-: ¬φ(f) v ¬φ(s) v ¬φ(h) ⊣ ⊢θ ¬φ(g).

Thus, according to Beall, given that each of the persons of the Trinity is identical to God, any predicate is true of God if and only if it is true of at least one or other of the persons of God and any predicate is false of God if and only if it is false of at least one of the divine persons. Thus, God has all the properties of each of the persons, but it is not the case that each person has all the properties of God (Beall 2023: 45).

I do have some concerns about this claim though. Beall recognizes that there must be exceptions to the principle that any predicate true of any one of the persons is true of God. The predicate ‘. . . is not triune’ is true of each of the persons, but it is not true of God. Beall intends to solve this problem by restricting the range of the schematic letter φ in the substitution entailment pattern to exclude “identity-involving” predicates (Beall thinks that ‘. . . is triune’ is defined in terms of the identity relations that hold between God and the persons). However, I am not sure this restriction will be sufficient to avoid all such problems. Here are three more exceptions to the principle that any predicate true of any one of the persons is true of God and I think none of these have yet been excluded by Beall’s proposed restriction:

1. The predicate ‘. . . is not both crucified and unbegotten’ is true of each of the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit, but it is not true of God.

2. The predicate ‘. . . is not contradictorily both crucified and uncrucified’ is true of each of the persons, but it is not true of God.

3. The predicate ‘being crucified is just true of . . .’ is true of the Son and ‘being crucified is just false of . . .’ is true of the Father, but neither of these is true of God.

These I think show that yet more restrictions are necessary for the inference patterns governing the Trinitarian identity relation. This is not a knock-down objection, but I think it suggests that we have an imperfect intuitive grasp of the non-transitive Trinitarian identity relation at the heart of Beall’s account of the Trinity.

Final Summary

Those familiar with Beall’s previous books will have an idea of what to expect here in terms of style and structure, and they won’t be disappointed. The book offers a highly developed and intricate account which involves a sophisticated technical apparatus, but also offers a robust defence both of the conclusions and of the relevance of the technical issues to the topics at hand. The technicalities are explained so as to be accessible to virtually any educated reader without a background in logic or formal semantics. Indeed, if the account of the Trinity offered in the book fails, the book might still achieve two important purposes in making aspects of contemporary logic and semantics understandable to an audience that might otherwise never come across them, as well as in demonstrating the potential significance of these developments to any given discourse. Beall follows his past practice of providing regular in-text parenthetical remarks which the reader can skip without losing their grasp on the overall argument. This allows Beall to keep technical details in the main text to the essentials. The result is a book that is rewarding for logicians with any positive degree of interest in Christian theology and for Christian theologians with any positive degree of interest in recent work in logic. I recommend it to both of these groups.

[1] No doubt opponents of Beall’s approach will point out that the Athanasian Creed has a very different place in different Christian traditions. In particular, it is accorded little to no weight in the Eastern Orthodox, Oriental Orthodox, and East Syriac traditions. So it might be argued that Beall’s account works at most for one strand of Christian theology.