Divine Hiddenness

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Howard-Snyder, Daniel and Moser, Paul K. (eds.), Divine Hiddenness, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 242pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521006104.

Reviewed by Robert McKim, University of Illinois


Then Jesus told [his disciples] plainly, “Lazarus is dead; and for your sake I am glad that I was not present so that you may believe.” (John 11, 14-15)

The point of this passage from the New Testament appears to be that it was better for the disciples of Jesus that Lazarus died and was raised from the dead. Seeing this miracle, they would believe. And it was beneficial to them to believe. But what of those who never witness a remarkable miracle such as this? Are they thereby disadvantaged? If so, is their being disadvantaged in this respect actually evidence against the existence of God since it makes the desirable state of belief more difficult for some than it is for others, thereby making the world unfair when it comes to the matter of acquiring theistic belief? Or are those who have not observed a belief-inducing miracle actually better off somehow on that account? Indeed could it be that the world is, on the whole, a better place in virtue of the fact that remarkable belief-inducing miracles are not so common? Correspondingly, would the world be a worse place if the existence of God were very evident or, for that matter, even a little more evident than is now the case?

The papers in this valuable and thought-provoking collection deal with these and related matters. Some are interesting philosophically, some are religiously interesting, and some are both. Some are even inspiring. The editors have provided a useful introduction to the main topic of the book and a synopsis of each paper and have raised some questions about each, in a few cases introducing objections.

The authors, with the titles of their papers, are as follows:

Peter Van Inwagen, What is the Problem of the Hiddenness of God?
J. L. Schellenberg , What the Hiddenness of God Reveals: A Collaborative Discussion
Michael J. Murray, Deus Absconditus
Laura L. Garcia, St. John of the Cross and the Necessity of Divine Hiddenness
William Wainwright, Jonathan Edwards and the Hiddenness of God
Paul K. Moser, Cognitive Idolatry and Divine Hiding
Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Divine Hiddenness: What is the Problem?
M. Jamie Ferreira, A Kierkegaardian View of Divine Hiddenness
Jacob Joshua Ross, The Hiddenness of God: A Puzzle or a Real Problem?
Paul Draper, Seeking but not Believing: Confessions of a Practicing Agnostic
Nicholas Wolterstorff, The Silence of the God Who Speaks

Many of the authors are responding to the work of John Schellenberg, both to his contribution to this volume and to his important earlier book Divine Hiddenness and Human Reason (Cornell, 1993). Schellenberg’s central contention is that if there were a loving God, persons who are at a certain time capable of a personal relationship with God would, at that time, believe that God exists unless they culpably believed otherwise. This is so because God would seek a personal relationship with everyone capable of it; such a relationship requires that the human parties to it believe that God exists; and, unless they culpably fail to believe, people will believe that God exists if they are provided with evidence sufficient for belief. But there are people who are presently capable of a personal relationship with God but who do not believe and whose nonbelief is not culpable. Therefore, there is no loving God.

Theists have proffered many purported explanations of where this reasoning goes wrong and, more broadly, of the reasons why what many theists themselves consider to be a relative lack of evidence for the existence of God is consistent with God’s existence. These include the following purported explanations, all of which put in an appearance in this volume:

  • God’s hiddenness is necessary if we are to be free to love, or trust, or have passionate faith in God.
  • God’s hiddenness is necessary if we are to undergo a certain sort of spiritual development or to have an important sort of control over the development of our character.
  • God’s hiddenness is necessary if theistic belief is not to be derived from improper motives.
  • God’s hiddenness is necessary to expose human depravity or ingratitude.
  • God’s hiddenness is necessary to prevent us from responding presumptuously to knowledge of God.
  • God’s hiddenness is the product of the fall of human nature.

Some explanations purport to account for why God is hidden, and for the extent to which God is hidden, from some individuals and not from others. Individualistic accounts of this sort usually reflect an assumption that the world is actually tailored just right in the case of each individual, so that each is confronted with the situation that is appropriate for him or her – an idea that generally goes hand-in-hand with the belief that God is looking after each individual, giving each what he or she needs. But needs for what purpose? Here there are various options. It might be a matter of what is needed in order to make a decision about wherein to place one’s trust, or a matter of what is needed for one’s spiritual development, or something else.

Individualistic accounts, or at least accounts with an individualistic component, might be appealed to in response to the case of Lazarus. The idea would be that the disciples of Jesus who were present at the raising of Lazarus got what they needed, what it was suitable for them to have. And those who do not observe any such miracle get what they need. All-purpose, one-size-fits-all, accounts, on the other hand, might include the appeal to the effects of the Fall. There can of course also be mixed accounts. Thus part of the explanation in the case of a particular individual may be an appeal to some characteristic that she shares in common with all others and part may be an appeal to something with respect to which people differ from each other.

Another individualistic account (discussed, or at least mentioned, in the essays by Van Inwagen, Moser, Murray, Garcia and Wainwright) construes God’s hiddenness as the product of some culpable defect in human nature. The assumption is that people differ with respect to the degree to which they possess the defect in question, and hence with respect to the degree to which God is hidden from them. Actually, this is best thought of as a family of accounts since different authors appeal to different defects. These include wrongful intentions, wrongful purposes, waywardness, sinfulness, a wrongful orientation of the human will, a disposition to respond incorrectly to evidence, the absence of a sincere openness to the truth, arrogance, and an unwillingness to worship or surrender to God. The contention in each case is that with the requisite moral transformation the defect will be corrected and the existence of God, and perhaps more besides, will be more apparent than is otherwise the case.

There are reasons to take this position seriously. We can all do with moral transformation that will shake us to the core and require us to reevaluate what is important to us – none more so, perhaps, than those who think it is otherwise in their own case. And the idea that there are aspects of reality that are accessible to us only if we have undergone a certain type of moral transformation is one that is familiar from other aspects of human experience.

Yet there are obvious pitfalls here. In particular there is the danger of a self-serving and self-congratulatory way of thinking and even the appearance, however misleading, of smugness. It is possible to come up with an impregnable web of mutually reinforcing beliefs, such as the following. We are on the right path, where this includes holding the right beliefs, participating in the right religious observances, and in general living in the right way. (We are even going to fare better than any other group in the afterlife.) On top of that, our unique recognition of the truth is facilitated by our moral superiority. So we win, however the score is kept. And the reason why others fail to believe as we believe is, at least in part, that there is something wrong with them. They have not undergone the requisite moral transformation. This maneuver enables each religious group to feel secure in its ability to disenfranchise the others, even at the cost of an insult or two. Everyone battens down the hatches in the face of outsiders.

Obviously, this strategy can be, and is, deployed by people from a number of religious traditions. While the Xs think that the Ys fail to accept Xist beliefs because of what is wrong with the Ys, the Ys return the compliment. And of course the appeal to deeply hidden motives that are responsible for others not being aware of what our group is aware of is one that can be made from secular points of view as well. It hardly follows that no group correctly makes these moves. And impregnable webs of mutually reinforcing beliefs are not in general a vice. Yet we can all agree that there is ample room for self-deception in such matters. Maybe we can agree too that confidence in this area is ill advised and that the sense of moral superiority involved can sometimes be dangerous.

Moreover, in making this move, each group would do well to consider the possibility that it may not be the most reliable judge of the relevant characteristics of its own members. Perhaps it would be best to consult an umpire who is not from the home team. Perhaps Christians, instead of declaring that they are the ones with the requisite dispositions or other characteristics, should ask Jews, Muslims, agnostics, Hindus, and so forth whether they, the Christians, do indeed exhibit the moral superiority that they believe themselves to possess. Perhaps Muslims whose confidence that they uniquely see the truth is buttressed by the assumption that their moral superiority is relevant to their being thus privileged should ask others (Christians, Baha’is, Jews, and so forth) whether they do indeed exhibit the moral superiority in question. What seems axiomatic to the insider may appear dubious, or even palpably false, to the outsider.

A one-size-fits-all approach is proposed by Ross. He proposes that we reject an anthropomorphic deity whom we can understand and with whom we can enter into a personal relationship, along with the literal readings of religious statements that foster this understanding. We should turn instead to a more subtle and sophisticated approach and a more mysterious and more ineffable deity. He suggests that the divine is a reality that none of our theological systems of ideas is capable of capturing. He is especially wary of what he takes to be the simple monotheistic net, preferring the mystical strand in each of the theistic traditions.

Clearly, it is important to consider the possibility that in the case of a deity we are dealing with something that is largely beyond our comprehension. However, the problem with a completely mysterious being would be that it would be of no religious interest. Still, there is room for a sort of theological agnosticism (Schellenberg’s term in an irenic ending to his contribution to this collection) that eschews pat, simple-minded and over-confident answers and yet is rich enough to sustain a measure of participation in one or other of the theistic religions. This is an interesting area for further study.

Agnosticism is also the central theme in Draper’s essay. He notes that there is an abundance of evidence concerning God’s existence. But this evidence is ambiguous, which is to say that it is difficult to weigh. In addition, neither theism nor naturalism is intrinsically more probable than the other and each is intrinsically more probable than any of the alternatives, such as nontheistic religious alternatives. Draper argues that agnosticism is the only reasonable response in this situation.

However, his is not an indifferent agnosticism. He thinks that he ought to cultivate or at least prepare for a relationship with God, and spend time reconsidering the evidence he has, both for and against theism, and looking for new evidence. He thinks that he ought to pray since there just “might be” a God listening to his prayers. So his is a religiously engaged agnosticism, although he does not say whether he thinks this to be the only reasonable form of agnosticism.

What sort of prayers would these be? How frequently might they be offered? For example, might they be offered constantly – say, as often as the average theist engages in prayer? Would the prayers be, say, recognizably Christian, Jewish or Muslim? Or would they consist in a mere openness to there being something to religion after all? Also, “preparing for a relationship with God” might require more than prayer: what about rituals and participation in religious ceremonies, and so forth? But if there is involvement with these, which ones should they be? Maybe Draper would take the conservative position that religious agnostics of his sort should participate in whatever forms of religion are most familiar to them, perhaps because they have no reason to pursue what is unfamiliar and hence more difficult.

Wolterstorff’s concern is with God’s failure to explain why things have gone terribly awry in human life. Lives are blighted by suffering and cut short. The divine experiment of creating human beings has not worked out. One thing that is impressive about Wolterstorff’s paper, which is reminiscent of his moving book Lament for a Son (Eerdman’s, 1987) is that he eschews easy responses to these observations; in fact he eschews all answers. (“[We] get no answer. None that I can discern. We confront non-answering silence. We confront the biblical silence of the biblical God. We shall have to live in the silence.”)

Wolterstorff’s response to this silence is largely practical. Its central ingredients include a determination to be faithful, protest in the face of pointless suffering and early death, and an intense commitment to struggle on the side of God and against the processes and influences that lead things to go awry in human life. I wonder how extensive, in his view, is the silence that he discusses. Does it extend beyond the absence of answers to the particular questions he raises here? If so, in what directions and how far? What are the theological implications of acknowledging its existence? I would think they would be considerable.

Actually, I wonder how much difference there will be between a Rossian mystical practitioner, a Draperian religious agnostic, and a Wolterstorffian within whose thinking the silence of God plays a prominent role. Might some of these be, say, the same person on different days?

Next, a sociological point. Theism, in this collection, is almost without exception taken to be Christianity and Judaism, thereby leaving out around half of the theists on the planet. Consider the following. In certain circles a book concerning a topic such as this would once have taken for granted that only, say, Roman Catholic perspectives are to be taken into account. Great progress has been made in that work such as this is now engaged in a less narrow and parochial and more inclusive way. It is taken for granted that other Christians are part of the conversation. So too are Jews. In this volume there is some discussion of the Judeo-Christian tradition, where the assumption is that this is one tradition in spite of its variety.

But there is no hint that the Islamic tradition might also be a suitable participant in the discussion. Why is this? Perhaps it is because the spectrum of possibilities that are included is not the product of systematic reflection but rather is in part a matter of fashion, of what is in vogue in the relevant scholarly circles, and of who is talking to whom. What exactly are the traditions to be probed is largely an unexamined assumption. My guess is that before too long the lacuna I have identified will seem as parochial as writing about an issue in Christian theism from a Protestant point of view while ignoring the Catholic and Orthodox strands. And this development will reflect a larger, and much more important, cultural shift.

Briefly, other contributions to this volume include the following. Kvanvig argues that someone who thinks that the evidence for and the evidence against theism are counterbalanced and who also argues from God’s hiddenness to atheism is cooking the books. Ferreira examines the Kierkegaardian claim that once God is understood in religiously relevant terms and once appropriate commitment to God is seen to be absolute, a probabilistic or cumulative case for God’s existence will be recognized to be irrelevant. “[Divine] hiddenness is logically implied in the notion of God’s absoluteness.” (169-70)

In addition to its considerable merits as a contribution to scholarship, this book is an excellent pedagogical tool, both for undergraduate and graduate level courses. The essays are written in an engaging and accessible style and the central themes will be of interest to students.