Divine Motivation Theory

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Linda Zagzebski, Divine Motivation Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 428pp, $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 052153576x

Reviewed by John Hare, Yale University


Linda Zagzebski's book, Divine Motivation Theory is an important contribution to the growing literature within analytic philosophy that is concerned with the relation between ethical theory and theology. It belongs with Robert Adams's Finite and Infinite Goods, with Thomas Carson's Value and the Good Life, and (if this is not presumptuous) with my own The Moral Gap. I read some of the manuscript in a week-long session which Linda mentions, in which Robert Roberts and Linda and I met to discuss projects we were all engaged in. Calvin College paid for this session, and it was an excellent format that should be repeated. I think all three of us learned a great deal (much more than at the usual conference). One area of overlap is that Linda and I both want to develop a theory independent of theism, in which moral realist and expressivist themes are combined. I call my theory 'prescriptive realism' and she calls hers 'motivation-based virtue ethics'. We both want to go on to describe a version of this theory with theistic foundations, and in her case the combination results in what she calls 'divine motivation theory'. In what follows I will make comments about both of these two projects of hers. Most of what I say will express disagreements or requests for further clarification, because I think this is usually the most helpful thing a reviewer can do. But I do not want this to obscure my admiration for the book, which is both well-written and breaks significant new ground.

The book relies on (relatively) new developments in philosophy that are not themselves part of ethical theory, and I want to start by expressing hesitation about the way these developments are used. The first development is the Kripke/Putnam theory that 'water is H2O' is a necessary a posteriori judgment that we discover to be true empirically. On this view 'water' is a rigid designator, picking out the items that we initially baptize with the term and other items in 'the same liquid relation' to the relevant local stuff, and we intend by our use of the term that these items necessarily have the structure that we go on to discover. Linda Zagzebski applies the theory to ethics by taking 'good' to be a term that we use to designate rigidly in the same way, where the items are exemplars of good people. These are all people, she says, with practical wisdom, and she lists Socrates and Gandhi and Jesus. Since exemplars are supposed to come from all civilizations across time and the globe, I doubt whether there is enough consensus to get the reference fixed (consider Abraham and Oprah), but I will not discuss this point further. My hesitation is that she describes this exemplarism as a 'definition' of the term. Perhaps it is a definition in some loose sense (as in 'ostensive definition'), but it is not a 'definition' in the Kripke/Putnam semantics. Putnam, for example, would say that the exemplars fix the reference or the extension. The problem is that it is not clear that divine motivation theory ends up with a definition at all. We end up with just the exemplar, God, with 'good' being whatever God is motivated to bring about. Because we cannot know the structure of God's motivation, the structure of our basic evaluative vocabulary remains necessarily off-limits to us.

This point is connected to a second one, which comes from a development in the theory of emotions. Many recent thinkers, for example, Robert Roberts, have emphasized the cognitive content of the emotions. In Emotions Roberts is concerned to give what he calls the 'defining proposition' of each emotion, defining emotions in general as 'concern-based construals'. Linda Zagzebski's theory does not use the notions of 'concern' or 'construal', and talks instead of the 'intentional object' of each emotion. But I could not understand the way she uses this term. She initially sets up the 'intentional object' as the thing about which one has the emotion. Her standard example is pity, and the intentional object is the person one perceives as pitiful when one has the emotion. As a side-point, I think the term 'pitiful' is more often used as a term of contempt, and this should be significant in our analysis of these two emotions. So I will use, for the purposes of this discussion, the term 'dangerous' and the emotion of fear. The intentional object should be the thing one fears as dangerous. But sometimes she talks about the intentional object being 'the pitiful' (or 'the dangerous'). A good emotion, she says, is one that fits its intentional object, in the way pity fits the pitiful and fear the dangerous (p. 76), or 'the property of lovability is the intentional object of the divine emotion of love' (p. 225). (Aristotle says, similarly, that we fear the terrible (phobos, phobera), and then he continues that these things are evil, so that we have the definition of fear as the expectation of evil, Nicomachean Ethics II, 6, 1115a7-9). But since she also thinks that emotions introduce propositional contexts, which are therefore in the technical sense 'opaque', she would be better off saying that the intentional object is the combination, the thing only qua held under the 'thick' description as dangerous.

This connects with the first point in the following way. It is important to the theory of the book to deny that we get any explanatory leverage on an exemplar's fear by saying that she fears something bad is going to happen. This is because the book wants to make emotion primary. 'We can understand all the principal concepts of interest to ethics by reference to the concept of a good emotion: a virtue, a right act, a virtuous act, an obligation, a good outcome, and the good for human beings.' (p. 385). I myself do not think it is a sensible aim to be monistic in this sort of way. But if we insist on defining all primary ethical concepts in terms of their relation to good emotion, we will be left unable to say that there is any greater clarity offered to the concept of 'dangerous' by 'perceiving that something bad is likely to happen' (as in Aristotle's and Roberts's theory). On motivation-based theory, the explanation has to be the other way around, that we understand 'bad' in the context of danger entirely in terms of 'fear'. My objection is that we will get something closer to a definition of the good motivation if we can begin to unpack the thick concepts like 'dangerous' ('begin' because we do not have to suppose the process can be completed, just that the analysis can be helped both ways, both by referring inward to the fear and by referring outward to what is bad about the thing feared). We will also get closer to a way to proceed when the emotions conflict. Perhaps the good threatened in the danger is less important than the good betrayed in breaking a promise. What explains why, for example, it is good that a person want to feed the hungry, is more importantly not something about the agent (her good emotion) but something about the recipients (that they need food). (Linda Zagzebski says, 'The good of an end is extrinsic because it is derived from the goodness of the motive to bring it about', p. 99.) It is true that motivation-based theory says that the good emotion (in this case, compassion) fits the 'intentional object'. But it insists that the priority in the order of explanation is inward (in the direction of 'compassion') not outward (in the direction of 'need'), and I would have assigned the priority the other way round. The motivation of a virtuous person is not, most centrally, to be motivated a certain way (though this will be a buttressing consideration) but to change things for the better. The virtues differ, however, in this respect, and we should not look for a single direction of explanation to fit all cases.

If we insist that 'dangerous' has to be understood in terms of what a good person (an exemplar) fears, this creates a problem for divine motivation theory that a less monistic account would avoid. The book wants to conclude that divine emotions are the source of all value. But God does not have emotions like fear, because God is not in our situation. So the theory has to be that what is dangerous is settled by the emotions that God would have if God were in our situation. ('The value of a human emotion in a given situation is limited by the emotions that God would have if He were in that situation', p. 226). But it is not clear that this suggestion makes sense. The book proposes that the difficulty here can be solved by the Incarnation, since Jesus presumably feared. But the fact that Jesus feared does not show us what God would fear if God were in our situation; it shows us what a truly good human fears.

I want to say something about love and will. One place this arises is the discussion of whether God has emotions. The book claims that persons are intrinsically emotional (p. 205), though it does not defend this claim, and interestingly this is not one of the five aspects of personhood it identifies as central (p. 192f). It claims that God is a person (p. 205, p. 213, where the protasis of the conditional is clearly detachable in both cases), and therefore has emotions. But it is doubtful whether God is, in Christian theology, a person, and in any case, I think it is doubtful that God has emotions in a way that is to be distinguished from God having a will. The book denies that God has a will, and this set of issues is worth exploring for a moment. Chapter Five considers the objection (from Aristotle and Thomas) that God does not have emotions because emotions are sensory appetites and God does not have a body. The chapter replies that emotions are not necessarily sensory, and leaves open the position of Aquinas that God does not have passions (which are sensory) but intellectual affections (such as love and joy). I think this is roughly right. But the point I want to make is that if we put love in the will in this way, it is inconsistent to then deny that God has a will. There are several places in the book where the undefended assumption is made that if we talk about love as a motivation, we are not talking about the will. But on the Thomist view, this is a mistake. For example, when defending the view that there is little in the New Testament about commandment and law, chapter six says, 'So even when commands appear in the New Testament, we are typically called not to will, but to be motivated in a virtuous way. So Saint Paul says, "Owe no-one anything but to love one another" (Romans 13:8).' (p. 239). I myself think that the New Testament is continuous with the Hebrew Scriptures in connecting love and commandment (see, for example, John 14: 15-31). It is important to reflect about what it means that love is commanded, given that there is something odd about commanding people to have emotions. This is the basis for Kierkegaard's extraordinary treatment of 'Thou shalt love' in Works of Love, (and also of Kant's treatment of what he calls 'practical love'). Divine Motivation Theory does not consider this matter, as far as I can determine. If we were allowed to talk about God's will, we could talk about God's will that we be afraid in some situations and not others, and the difficulty in the previous paragraph would disappear.

There is one more topic I want to discuss briefly, since I am a divine command theorist and divine motivation theory is argued to have five significant advantages over divine command theory. The first advantage is supposed to be the monistic or 'global' account of value, and I have already given some reasons for doubt about this. The second advantage is that a divine command theory (like Robert Adams's) has to make use of an ad hoc addition that what is right is settled by the commands of a loving God. But 'loving' is not an ad hoc addition, because Adams has already argued (though not in the 1979 article) that God is the supreme Good. The third advantage is purportedly that divine command theory needs a reason for God to will the good, since 'the will, according to Aquinas, always chooses "under the aspect of good," which means that reasons are not inherent in the will itself' (p. 261), whereas divine motivation theory already provides the reason in the motive. But for Aquinas the will, though it does not cognize the good (nihil volitum quin praecognitum), follows the good that the intellect provides, and in God there is no weakness or ignorance to produce a gap. The argument here again uses the undefended assumption that where we are talking of love we are not talking of the will, 'On the other hand, a divine command requires a reason, and if the reason is or includes fundamental divine motivational states such as love, it follows that even divine command theory needs to refer to God's motives in order to avoid the consequence that moral properties are arbitrary and that God Himself is not good. Such a move makes divine motives more basic than the divine will even in divine command theory.' The fourth advantage is supposed to be that divine motivation theory makes central use of the Incarnation, and I have already mentioned the difficulty with this view. The fifth advantage I have not seen how to distinguish from the first.

So much by way of raising difficulties. There is a great deal more in the book that deserves discussion (for example, whether divine motivation theory provides any significant help in solving the problem of evil), but there are space limits on this review. The book is full of rich and detailed argumentation and makes excellent use of examples from literature and life. There are unfortunately a number of typographical errors (I had decided not to mention this if there were fewer than ten), and the practice of capitalizing 'He', 'His', and 'Who' when referring to God (passing over the question of the gender language) is not consistently maintained. But the book is a pleasure to read, it is refreshingly free of jargon, and it will repay many-fold the careful attention of the reader.