Divine Self, Human Self: The Philosophy of Being in Two Gītā Commentaries

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Chakravarthi Ram-Prasad, Divine Self, Human Self: The Philosophy of Being in Two Gītā Commentaries, Bloomsbury, 2013, 148pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441154644.

Reviewed by Matthew R. Dasti, Bridgewater State University


Chakravarthi Ram-Prasad's delightful and challenging little book does not fit easily into the standard categories available for academic excursions into philosophy. It is, to simplify, a venture in constructive philosophical theology, centered on questions of being and selfhood, which takes the form of a reflection upon the Bhagavad-gītā commentaries written by two of India's leading philosopher/theologians, Śaṅkara (c. 8th century CE) and Rāmānuja (c. 11th century CE). While Ram-Prasad does try to argue for the best readings of Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, the book should not be misunderstood as a "merely" historical work. Ram-Prasad looks to the classical thinkers, and indeed the ancient text of the Bhagavad-gītā itself, for enduring insights into the nature of being. It speaks to a number of sub-disciplines within philosophy, including metaphysics, history of philosophy, Indian philosophy, philosophy of religion, and comparative philosophy/theology.

The Bhagavad-gītā ("Song of the Lord", hereafter, "Gītā"), while not officially an Upaniṣad, being embedded in a different textual strata, is of a similar proto-philosophical milieu, blending together philosophical reflection, mysticism, and critical reappraisal of the ancient Vedic culture that anticipated classical Hinduism. Like the Upaniṣads, the Gītā is centrally concerned with the nature of the deep self (ātman), the foundation of our psychophysical lives as individuals, and how that self relates to the ultimate ground of being, brahman. We may, however, note two of the features of the Gītā's content that distinguish it from the earlier Upaniṣads. First, it has an abiding concern with world-directed action. For the Gītā, the contemplative life does not require escaping the world, but rather unifying the apparently opposed practices of contemplation and socially-embedded action. Second, it provides a much more consistent and full-blooded personalism about the ultimate reality, brahman. For the Gītā, brahman, in the form of its speaker, Kṛṣṇa, is both the ground of being and a being who lovingly responds to the petitions of his devotees. These features of the Gītā provide further ethical and religious elements over and above its Upaniṣadic inheritance, and given all of this, few texts have captured the Indian philosophical imagination as strongly as it has. Thinkers from Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja to Abhinavagupta (10th century CE) to Gandhi have thus found themselves compelled to express the essentials of their thought through commentaries upon it.

The first chapter of Divine Self, Human Self focuses on Śaṅkara, whose non-dualist metaphysics is famously austere and uncompromising. The Upaniṣadic identification of self (ātman) and the ground of being (brahman) is taken by him to convey strict identity. There is simply a single, unitary, reflexive consciousness. The world of distinct things and individuals is, at its core, a cosmic confusion, to be overcome by philosophical reflection and contemplative practice in accord with Upaniṣadic teachings. Ram-Prasad starts by noting that the robust personalist theism of the Gītā seems to pose a real problem for Śaṅkara. In the Gītā, Kṛṣṇa is identified as a manifestation of the one God who creates, sustains, and cares for this universe of individual beings. The text goes so far as to claim that it is the personal Kṛṣṇa who is the foundation (pratiṣṭha) of brahman (Gītā 14.2). In his other works, Śaṅkara has argued that the notion of a personal creator God is, in effect, brahman viewed from the perspective of cosmic confusion. It too is meant to be forsaken in the ultimate experience of gnosis and immersion into the single, all-encompassing, non-personal consciousness that is brahman. Further, Śaṅkara has famously (or infamously, according to one's perspective) championed a method of scriptural interpretation in which descriptions of brahman as the unqualified ground of being are taken to be ultimately true, while descriptions of brahman as a God-like creator of the world are merely concessions to our own conceptual limitations, not expressive of the ultimate reality as such. Such descriptions are only true within the context of cosmic ignorance. This means, of course, that they are ultimately false. Against this background, a reader would be forgiven (and, it seems to me somewhat justified) in taking Śaṅkara's reading of the Gītā to involve minimizing or reading away its personalist theism in order to interpret its core message as comporting with his own metaphysical vision. But it is precisely this judgment that Ram-Prasad wishes to avoid, repeatedly suggesting that such a "quick" and "conventional" reading of Śaṅkara "should not tempt" us, and suggesting that his first chapter may be seen as an extended argument that such a reading is unwarranted (7, 11, 33-4).

How then, should we understand Śaṅkara's interpretation of the Gītā in relation to his non-dual metaphysics of being? Ram-Prasad starts by focusing on the portions of Śaṅkara's commentary (primarily on Gītā 2.16 and 15.16), where he develops his criteria for genuine existence. Being -- that which is fundamentally real -- is characterized by permanence. As for non-being, as Ram-Prasad puts it, "Strictly speaking, every entity whose identity is given by changeable qualities is non-existent" (4). As a consequence, the ordinary objects and categories of common experience are merely so many (merely apparent!) modes of non-being. Śaṅkara is thus uninterested in the realists' project of schematizing the contents of ordinary experience into substance, property, universal, and the like, and seeks a much more radical and profound distinction between the real and the unreal, between being proper and particular beings. Being itself, he argues, is given in all instances of experience, but must be teased out from entanglement with the perishable and discrete objects of experience through philosophical reflection. It is further identified with the deep self, proclaimed in the Upaniṣads, since -- in an argument that anticipates the cogito -- any apprehension of non-being takes place against the background of unqualified conscious awareness, which can neither be doubted nor refuted.

Have we reached brahman? Not exactly. As Ram-Prasad illustrates, Śaṅkara argues that brahman is beyond both being and non-being. That it cannot be identified with non-being is obvious. But it is not merely equivalent to being either. Śaṅkara trades on a common locution in the Gītā, that the ultimate reality transcends both being and non-being, and on that basis distinguishes brahman in that it contains "the possibility of being" (5), and is therefore ontologically fundamental to it. Ram-Prasad interprets this move as Śaṅkara's striving "towards what may be called a transmetaphysics, an exhaustion of the limits of discursive understanding of our phenomenological being so that what lies beyond our own being is realized in our being" (6).

Ram-Prasad next argues that Śaṅkara interprets the preeminent role of the personal God in the Gītā according to two hermeneutical strategies. First, he takes Kṛṣṇa's declarations that he is the self (cf. Gītā 10.20) to indicate that Kṛṣṇa's own self-identification is with the single universal self, brahman. Unlike our own confused use of "I", which tends to conflate our deep selfhood with the various imposed contingencies of mundane life, Kṛṣṇa's self-reference in the Gītā "points us towards the liberating awareness of the universality of self" (10). Thus, Śaṅkara does not exactly read away the personal God of the Gītā, but understands it as a central part (though only a part) of the gnoseological inquiry into selfhood. Second, Ram-Prasad calls attention to Śaṅkara's use of an interesting locution when speaking of the names of God used in the Gītā, adding the term ākhyam, "named" or "so-called" to form phrases like "brahman, which is called Kṛṣṇa". Ram-Prasad argues that this move is not merely a gesture toward apophatic theology and the via negativa, a critical awareness of the limitations of our language in speaking of God. Rather, it "points to the limitation of God as that of which we speak. . . . we cannot speak of brahman as such. God becomes the way language mediates consciousness' understanding of itself (self that it is) as brahman" (11).

Śaṅkara thus reads the passages in the Gītā that present an apparent monotheism and personal God as orienting us, so to speak, toward non-dual, unqualified brahman. He (God) is central to the project of our own inquiry into being and discovery of the deep self which is brahman in that God allows us to redirect ourselves toward that self which is our truest essence, by directing ourselves toward him. The personal God is thus both a cognitive bridge to discover the self as well as a praxiological compass to direct us toward the self. Ram-Prasad concludes that Śaṅkara thus affirms the personal God of the Gītā and the pietistic devotion enjoined therein, but as reinterpreted within Śaṅkara's non-dual metaphysics and gnoseological project of rediscovering the single, unified self.

The subject of the second chapter, Rāmānuja, also finds his metaphysical vision informed by the Upaniṣadic inquiry into brahman and the notion that brahman and the world are non-dualistically related. But for Rāmānuja -- who was a vociferously hostile challenger to Śaṅkara -- this non-dualism is not strict identity but rather a kind of holism. The real, pluralist universe of myriad individuals and things is unified in God. Therefore, Rāmānuja find the personalist theism of the Gītā a more amenable place. His task in interpreting the Gītā, as identified by Ram-Prasad, is to explain where brahman fits in the scheme of an otherwise straightforward theism.

To start, Rāmānuja develops a notion that there are three real, though ontologically graded features of reality: God, individual selves, and materiality. All three are in fact spoken of as brahman, in some way, in the Gītā. Unlike Śaṅkara, who understands that these various things are brahman insofar as they are superimpositions upon the ultimate, unified, non-dual ground of being, Rāmānuja takes their non-duality to be entirely consistent with a pluralist, realist metaphysics. To this end, he provides an analysis of God as the Self of the world and the individual selves who populate it. Self is analyzed as related to body, and it is the supporter, controller, and principal of the body, which is supportedcontrolled, and accessory. As universal Self, God thus bears the world and the selves who populate it as a subject bears its modes or properties. There is thus a real kind of non-dualism. We may refer to the property-bearer through talk of its properties, and on this basis, the Upaniṣadic locution "x is brahman" may be nonfiguratively understood. Yet, as the "higher brahman", God is not reducible to the world, and is beyond being-qua-individual selves and being-qua-materiality, maintaining his ultimate sovereignty and freedom. Though Self of the world, he is free from the fluctuations and destruction that beset his modes. Even the individual selves, though ontologically dependent upon God, are in reality free from the fluctuations of materiality. Ram-Prasad argues that Rāmānuja's gnostic telos is not escape from non-being into being, but realization of oneself under another, higher order of being (44), as an individual whose identity is not fundamentally determined by her current psychophysical circumstances, but, to anticipate, by unearthing her eternal relationship with the ultimate Self.

Accordingly, Rāmānuja's notion of brahman as "higher" is taken to provide a framework that circumscribes the role of philosophical inquiry into being. Ram-Prasad argues that given his rejection of the natural theology of Nyāya in other works, Rāmānuja would join Heidegger in repudiating the excesses of onto-theology, i.e., the prideful refusal to accept that human knowledge has limits and God is outside of such limits (47-50). Rāmānuja's analysis of the nature of reality is not meant to provide an intellectual conquering of God, so to speak, but to provide a map that fundamentally identifies our nature as dependent. True gnosis is achieved through the transformation of the individual who realizes her complete dependence upon the personal brahman and acts in a spirit of gratitude, love, and openness to grace (57-8). This gnosis is underwritten by the fact that for all of the asymmetries that hold between individual selves and the ultimate Self, there is a fundamental and fixed relation between God as Self and individuals as selves. God's otherness and hiddenness is overcome by his own compassionate grace, which is enshrined in the Gītā's doctrine of avatāra, the breaking-in of the divine into the mundane world. Here, Ram-Prasad invites the reader to recognize, and further to accept, a tension in Rāmānuja. While ontologically God is asymmetrically fundamental to all else, in a loving spirit of grace, Kṛṣṇa is spoken of as willfully indebted to the love of his devotees (70-1).

So much for divine selfhood. The final chapter is a sophisticated reflection on this side of things, using Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja as the point of departure for a discussion of human personhood in light of their Vedāntic metaphysics. Here, Ram-Prasad advances the study of classical Indian philosophies by clearly identifying the ways in which Indian notions of selfhood do not map easily onto discussions of personhood. It is true that debates over selfhood are some of the most important and rich elements of classical Indian thought. But for most classical non-Buddhist Indian thinkers, the substance-self (ātman) is just one component (though admittedly, the most important) of the complex psychophysical composite which is a person. Ram-Prasad argues that the classical Indian thinkers engage in the "de-linking of selfhood from personhood" (83). One could quibble with Ram-Prasad's further intimation that this more abstract notion of the self does not provide for conditions that underwrite personal identity (83). I would argue, for example, that the Nyāya notion, shared to some degree by Rāmānuja, sees each self as a distinct and irreducible "location" of psychological properties, such that I could never be the location of your psychological states and vice-versa. A necessary condition for my continued personal identity is that my fluctuating psychological states share the same location, that is, they are properties of my self. Further, the self not only co-locates such properties, but synthesizes them such that they form a coherent, organic unity, a person. But, in any case, such debate is advanced precisely because Ram-Prasad's take on this issue calls attention to a distinctive, fecund problem space that should interest scholars of Indian philosophy for some time.[1]

Ram-Prasad further identifies the way in which the notion of personal agency is central to the commentators' accounts of personhood in the Gītā. For Śaṅkara, while an individual's sojourn toward self-knowledge and ultimate realization of the non-dual brahman requires developing the right sort of agency, the very notion of oneself as an individual who acts must ultimately be abandoned as a falsehood. Ram-Prasad notes that while this comports well with Śaṅkara's metaphysics, it does make the "entire psychophysical drama of the Gītā . . . penultimate in meaning for Śaṅkara" (101). Considering Rāmānuja on agency, Ram-Prasad rightly notes that his account is more complicated, as Rāmānuja attempts to give due to both the Vedāntic notion that the deep self is not an agent as commonly understood, and to the religiously central notion that human acts of love toward God are meaningful. Ram-Prasad argues that Rāmānuja does this by subsuming the agency of the individual within the benevolent agency of God (103). Here, it seems to me that Ram-Prasad's interpretation, while sophisticated and penetrating, doesn't entirely do justice to Rāmānuja's vigorous defense of human agency as a real part of the inventory of reality. Rāmānuja's concession to the apparent Vedāntic denial of the self's agency is a call to remember that an individual's genuine agency must never be seen as independent of a host of supporting conditions, including her body/mind complex (what Ram-Prasad broadly calls "materiality"), and of course, most fundamentally, God.[2] Accordingly, Rāmānuja (in, e.g., his commentary on Gītā 18.15) does not read the apparent denial of individual agency in the Gītā as strictly as Ram-Prasad (e.g., "the Gītā is clear in asserting that ātman is non-agentive" (102)).

Divine Self, Human Self is well-written and philosophically cogent. As in his other works, Ram-Prasad shows a gift for homing in on important but underappreciated issues in classical Indian philosophy. Scholars of Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, and Indian thought more generally, will find much of interest. Non-specialists in Indian thought should find Ram-Prasad a guide that conveys the best of the classical thinkers in refreshingly vivid ways, while refusing to sacrifice their complexity. In this regard, his use of comparative philosophy is apt and not overdone. Ram-Prasad engages in comparative discursions not to fawn over interesting similarities, but to find appropriate footholds for constructive interpretation.

[1] Ram-Prasad develops this theme (and engages more directly with the Nyāya view I mention above) in the recently published "Self and Memory: Personal Identity and Unified Consciousness in Comparative Perspective". See Irina Kuznetsova, Jonardon Ganeri and Chakravarthi Ram-Prasad (eds.) Hindu and Buddhist Ideas in Dialogue: Self and No-Self (Farnham, Surrey: Ashgate, 2012), 129-145.

[2] Here, I am persuaded by Ganeri's contention that, for Rāmānuja, "renunciation of agency is really an act of mental realignment, whereby the finite self gets free from attachment to its actions and realizes for itself its nature and bliss as the body of the Supreme Self, rather than any giving up on its own agency as such." See Martin Ganeri, "Free Will, Agency, and Selfhood in Rāmānuja" in Matthew R. Dasti and Edwin F. Bryant (eds.) Free Will, Agency, and Selfhood in Indian Philosophy (New York: Oxford University Press, 2014), 249-50.