Division III of Heidegger's Being and Time: The Unanswered Question of Being

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Lee Braver (ed.), Division III of Heidegger's Being and Time: The Unanswered Question of Being, MIT Press, 2015, $45.00 (hbk), 362pp., ISBN 9780262029681.

Reviewed by Sacha Golob, King's College London


Heidegger’s Sein und Zeit is, famously, an unfinished work, rushed in to print in the face of awkward questions from an appointments committee about Heidegger’s lack of publications (Ga14:99; see the list of abbreviations below). Until the 7th edition in 1953 the published text was labelled as the “first half” of the work, and yet a glance at the plan set out in SZ shows how optimistic even this was (SZ: 39-40). Part 2, intended to be an exercise in the “destruction”, in Heidegger’s distinctive sense of that term, of “traditional ontology”, is entirely missing.  So is the third Division of Part 1, a Division whose title would have been “Time and Being”. It is this omission which is philosophically more significant. Thanks to published texts such as the Kant book, Ga3, and the many historically focussed lecture courses, we have a good idea of what Part 2 might have looked like. Yet the status of Division III of Part 1 is less clear. There is, of course, the 1962 lecture “On Time and Being”, but this is separated from SZ by more than 30 years and a vast array of conceptualistic and stylistic shifts: as Harman observes, it is “nearly comically different in tone” from Sein und Zeit (118). A much more plausible surrogate is the 1927 lecture course Die Grundprobleme der Phänomenologie, which claims to provide at least some of the missing material (Ga24:1). However, as we will see, matters are not so simple. There are deep internal problems with Ga24 itself. More broadly, this is a period in which Heidegger’s work starts to undergo the multiple methodological and philosophical changes that mark the development and ultimate abandonment of the Sein und Zeit project.

Reconstructing Division III is thus not simply a matter of piecing together what it might have contained, but of making sense of why it failed to appear, and why, how and when Heidegger realised that it could no longer function as originally envisaged. Thinking through the fate of Division III thus brings one into direct contact with the key issues that both span and divide Heidegger’s early and later work. Consider, for example, his suggestions that Sein und Zeit failed due to its reliance on “the language of metaphysics” or its dependence on a transcendental framework (Ga9:327-8; Ga65 250, 305 468; Ga71:§181). In other words, by understanding Division III, we can come to better understand both Heidegger’s own intellectual trajectory and the merits, or otherwise, of his legacy.

Given all this, the book under review is extremely welcome. It brings together some of the most prominent Heideggerian commentators to discuss Division III — and the implications both of its absence and of its potential reconstruction. As the editor, Lee Braver, observes, this project is very much in line with Heidegger’s own exegetical ambition of tracing the unsaid, mapping those ideas which the canon was unable to clearly formulate or control (2).

Let me start by saying that this is a superb volume and I recommend it highly to anyone interested in Heidegger’s work, under whatever aspect. There are sixteen essays and I learnt something new from every one. Several pieces — the second Alain Badiou essay, and the articles by Denis McManus, Eric S. Nelson, Richard Polt and Katherine Withy — are worth the admission price by themselves. Given the space available I am not going to be able to discuss each contribution, but the quality is exceptionally high throughout. Some of the essays inevitably draw on broader, longstanding research programmes (particularly those by Graham Harman and Thomas Sheehan) but they remain accessible. If I have one complaint, it is that, infuriatingly, there is no common reference system, with some chapters citing a varied range of English translations rather than the German: this, plus the resulting alphabet soup of title abbreviations, many of which refer to collections culled from multiple original sources, means that it is not always immediately obvious what exact passage is being referenced. This is annoying, but it is not a serious problem.

The book ranges across the central philosophical issues raised by Division III — in particular subjectivity, time, metaphysics — whilst also testing what one might call the ‘meta-issues’: Nelson’s chapter, for example, presses the question of what exactly it might mean to say that SZ ‘failed’? One of the volume’s main attractions is the way in which different chapters combine to offer a range of perspectives on a single issue. Take the example of subjectivity. As Theodore Kisiel observes, Ga24 is insistent that Kant’s basic focus on subjectivity was correct, even if the Critique framed matters far too narrowly (245-6; Ga24:103). Yet by the 1930s subjectivity is viewed by Heidegger as deeply problematic — this growing suspicion underpinned his concerns surrounding humanism. So we need to understand what exactly “subjectivity” implies, and how and where his views on it change. How, for example, does it connect to notions like the transcendental or the universal or to particular views of the self or of the entities experienced by such a subject? The articles by McManus, Polt, and François Raffoul in particular provide a panorama around these issues, exemplifying the impressive capacity of the essays here to complement each other, despite the fact that several were originally written in different contexts.

Given the range of themes and styles in play, from Kisiel’s trademark mastery of the archival material to Withy’s attentiveness to the poetics of Heidegger’s writings, anything like a summary of the chapters would almost require a book in itself. So I want instead to focus on two key issues which structure the collection and which might help the reader to locate some of the positions discussed there. The first is time and the second is metaphysics.

The obvious place to start in reconstructing Division III is the end of Division II. This famously closes with a series of unanswered questions:

The existential-ontological constitution of Dasein’s totality is grounded in temporality . . . How is this mode of the temporalizing of temporality (Zeitigungsmodus der Zeitlichkeit) to be interpreted? Is there a way which leads from primordial time to the meaning of being? Does time itself manifest itself as the horizon of being? (SZ: 437)1

It is natural to read Ga24 as trying to answer these questions by clarifying the relevant notion of time — in particular, by drawing a distinction between Zeitlichkeit, the temporal structure of Dasein itself, and Temporalität, the temporal horizon or framework in terms of which Dasein makes sense of entities (Ga24:324).2 As Nelson summarises: “The unpublished Division III was to have analyzed temporality as the transcendental horizon of posing and responding to the question concerning the sense and meaning of being.” (197)

This is in line with the proclaimed goal for Part 1 of SZ as a whole, namely the “explication of time as the transcendental horizon for the question of being” (SZ:40). Thus Braver in his Introduction: “Dasein’s being is, at bottom, temporal, so she understands in temporal terms. This means that the understandability of being must be temporal, or, put another way, time is the meaning of being.” (8)

The question I want to raise is how this should be understood. For example, Iain Thomson states — surely correctly — that: “In Being and Time Heidegger thought of temporality as a transcendental condition on the possibility of any understanding of being.” (p.304n10)

Polt meanwhile asserts that within SZ “time would serve as the ultimate condition of the possibility of experience” — and again this is surely correct (219). But how exactly should it be understood? Consider the following case. Suppose, like many philosophers, one is impressed by the idea that our life has a narrative structure defined by our self-identity, our goals and our history, a narrative structure in which the present is a function of the past and the future. For example, Daniel Dennett holds that: “we are all virtuoso novelists . . . We try to make all of our material cohere into a single good story. And that story is our autobiography. The chief fictional character . . . of that autobiography is one’s self.” (1988:17)

Suppose that you also believe that all human experience is saturated by the effects of language. This is quite a natural thing to believe if one’s paradigm is the novel. But it is also a familiar philosophical position: suppose you are a propositionalist of the same stripe as the Mind and World-era McDowell. This combination of views, both temporal and propositional, seems perfectly possible. And it remains perfectly possible even once you start to add in trademark Heideggerian ideas about the nature of time: for example, that the future should be understood in terms of various ‘for-the-sakes-of-which’, that serve as ongoing points of orientation through which I understand myself and which cannot be achieved and set aside like other goals.3 Suppose, furthermore, that these ‘for-the-sakes-of-which’ imply certain distinctive abilities or ‘know how’. We still do not have any tension in the view: Dennett’s novelist ‘knows how’ to spin the yarn. In short, we have a position that combines, through the idea of narrative, the temporal and the propositional. Yet — and this is the key — the position is surely not early Heidegger’s: he is clear that propositions and assertions are derivative modes of experience (SZ:157-8; Ga26:156; Ga29/30:493). But is this because of some separate aspect of his thought or is it because my example does not really push the idea of time far enough? What I am suggesting is that one might usefully approach the various commentators by asking in what precise sense they see time as “fundamental” to or “determinative of” experience in SZ? How exactly does time determine the character of Heideggerian experience — is SZ‘s theory of temporality per se neutral on issues such as conceptualism and nonconceptualism? If the narrative example marks one end of the spectrum, the other end would be to argue that the distinctive role of time as a transcendental horizon, as Temporalität rather Zeitlichkeit, makes possible an understanding of entities that is inherently distinct from that of language. The main obstacle to this approach is providing the necessary details: what Sheehan rightly calls the “very meagre” account of Temporalität provided in Ga24 doesn’t exactly help (271). But I have argued elsewhere (2014: Ch3) that this was indeed Heidegger’s view and that the details are worked out in his lectures on Plato and on Kant — on my own reading, to understand Division III, we need to look to the materials that would have composed Part 2 of SZ.(2014: Ch3) But whatever stance one takes here, the basic question is a useful one — what does it mean to take time as fundamental to experience? How much does that imply?

The second issue I want to flag, again one in terms of which the arguments in this volume might be usefully located, is the status of metaphysics. Badiou’s two essays are particularly helpful here: the first asks what marks the familiar Greek texts as the founding place of metaphysics as opposed to, say, their Egyptian counterparts, whilst the second examines the multiple non-equivalent notions of metaphysics and of its repudiation visible in the canon (the positivist challenge is clearly not same as the critical one). Heidegger’s own various attacks on metaphysics are in part an attack on the view of entities which metaphysics has endorsed — from Kant’s tendency to think of Dasein as a substance to the technical conception of nature that marks modernity. Yet this is not all he is unhappy with: his objection to metaphysics is more fundamentally that it overlooks some condition or structure that underlies any of these views. As he puts it himself:

Metaphysics is at an end not because it inquired too much too uncritically and too misleadingly into the beingness [Seiendheit] of entities but because as a consequence of deviating from the first beginning metaphysics with this inquiry, it could never inquire into be-ing [Seyn] as what is fundamentally sought after; and in the end, perplexed by this powerlessness, metaphysics lapsed into the ‘renewal’ of ‘ontology’. (Ga65:173)

The key, in other words, is something over and above entities. Thus Thomson talks of how:

The western tradition of substance metaphysics (that is, the metaphysics of presence) systematically overlooks that dynamic phenomenological excessiveness (the bottomless abyss of ‘presencing’) which is needed to explain how the metaphysical tradition can change over time. (296)

My suggestion is again to categorise and question the authors based on where they stand on this idea. We can note some immediate concerns. If the issue is framed as an explanation of how one understanding of being comes to replace another, then it is hard to see how Heidegger can offer anything but a deeply compromised answer. The question of how the medieval vision gave way to the modern one is surely better approached by something closer to a Foucauldian genealogy or even a straightforward historical research programme: it seems perverse to study such a change by focussing as Heidegger does almost exclusively on philosophical texts, and treating as epiphenomenal the huge number of economic, military and other developments also involved.4 There are other worries too: in view of his continuous neglect of non-human animals, is it really ‘presencing’ in which Heidegger is interested — is it not more ‘presencing’ to a very specific type of perceiver? Given that restriction, though, is it plausible that the canon has failed to address this — is such a project not just another turn on the transcendental wheel, albeit with the transcendental conditions cut free from the traditional model of the subject?

As the volume illustrates, there are several alternative ways that that one might read Heidegger on these issues. For example, Braver and Julian Young pursue a roughly similar line, focussing on wonder at the mere fact of “appropriating”: wonder, as Braver puts it, “that we have an understanding at all” (13; similarly 69-71). Underlying this wonder is the following “mystery” (69).

We cannot account for the source of all appearing without appealing to apparent entities, which unhelpfully presupposes appearance. As with the big bang — which could only be explained by entities that it itself as the origin of all that is supposed to explain — all explanations come too late. (70)

Yet this approach likewise leaves Heidegger facing some awkward questions. If “apparent” and “appearing” here imply “apparent/appearing to someone” — us or an animal — then the claim is false: there is no need to appeal to apparent entities to explain appearing since I could do so in terms of supervenience on certain material facts, for example.5 If “appearing” and “apparent” mean something closer to “having being” then there is indeed a kind of paradox — how can one explain the existence and being of entities in general when our models for explanation are resolutely inter-ontic? Yet this type of worry, often expressed via the ‘first cause’ debate, is not exactly new. Supporters of this reading need to explain why Heidegger has supposedly gone to such baroque lengths to draw our attention to a puzzle discussed ad nauseaum in every introductory guide to philosophy. Young’s article ends with some interesting, but sketchy remarks on Zen Buddhism, and on the sense in which Heidegger’s views might be considered as “a kind of koan, a spiritual exercise” — perhaps that could provide some kind of answer (346).

In conclusion, this is a rich and fascinating book. I have tried to suggest two paths along which one might approach it. My own view is that Heidegger abandoned Division III because he recognised, in the late 1920s, that temporality was unable to do the strong transcendental work his system required of it, the work I sketched above. The recognition of this failure led him to seek an alternative: freedom. Thus by 1931 he is willing to state simply that freedom is “prior even to being and time” (Ga31:134). As Kisiel neatly puts it, there was a “displacement of Temporality by freedom” (159) — this seems to me largely correct.


References are to the Gesamtausgabe edition (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1975 — ; abbreviated as Ga), with the exception of SZ , where I use the standard text (Tübingen: Max Niemeyer, 1957).

SZ Sein und Zeit (Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1957)

Ga3 Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik (1998)

Ga9 Wegmarken (1976)

Ga14 Zur Sache des Denkens (2007)

Ga24 Die Grundprobleme der Phänomenologie (1997)

Ga26 Metaphysische Anfangsgr ü nde der Logik im Ausgang von Leibniz

Ga29/30 Die Grundbegriffe der Metaphysik (1983)

Ga31 Vom Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit (1982)

Ga65 Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis) (1989)

Ga71 Das Ereignis (2009)


Blattner, W. (1999), Heidegger’s Temporal Idealism, Cambridge University Press.

Dennett, D. (1988). ‘Why Everyone is a Novelist’, Times Literary Supplement 16-22, September 1988.

Golob, S. (2014), Heidegger on Concepts, Freedom and Normativity, Cambridge University

1 I follow the standard Macquarrie and Robinson translation here (Being and Time, trans. J. Macquarrie and E. Robinson, Harper and Row, 1962).

2 Ultimately the distinction picks out two sides of a single phenomenon, but marking it allows Heidegger to be much clearer on the multiple roles which time plays in his system.

3 Ultimately the distinction picks out two sides of a single phenomenon, but marking it allows Heidegger to be much clearer on the multiple roles which time plays in his system.

4 One might answer that these developments are ultimately to be explained by philosophical changes. Aside from grossly flattering the significance of philosophy, this relies on a crudely mono-causal view of history which no historian would accept.

5 There are, of course, all kinds of familiar issues with the details of that proposal, but presumably Heidegger’s point is meant to be sweeping enough to be independent of such matters.