Do We Really Understand Quantum Mechanics?

Placeholder book cover

Franck Laloë, Do We Really Understand Quantum Mechanics?, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 406pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107025011.

Reviewed by Valia Allori, Northern Illinois University


Do we really need another book on quantum mechanics? Quantum mechanics is one of the greatest scientific achievements, and yet it is still controversial how we should interpret it and what conclusions we are entitled to draw from it. Because of this, it has inevitably attracted many writers, both physicists and philosophers. So, hasn't enough ink been spilled about the subject already? Who needs more? Surprisingly enough, Franck Laloë has shown us that there is still room for another valuable contribution Laloë provides us with a great addition to the abundant (sometimes even redundant) literature. On the one hand we find technical books (for instance Sakurai, or Messiah), while on the other we have introductory books (Albert, Maudlin, and Ghirardi). The former kind of book is full of mathematical details and focused on formal results and so of great value for students needing to learn how to do calculations, solve problems and perform experiments. But such a book is totally useless if one wishes to get a realist picture of the quantum world since it totally ignores the conceptual problems that plague the foundations of quantum mechanics. In contrast, the latter kind of book usually has the aim of introducing the subject to philosophy students, who usually are interested in understanding rather than computing. As a result, this kind of book often disregards technicalities and focuses primarily on the problems of interpreting the formalism and on the possible realist interpretations of the theory. While this approach is extremely valuable in making the conceptual problems crystal clear, its danger is that the philosopher, when confronted with particularly challenging technical material, might still be unable to get around it and arrive at the correct conclusions without being obfuscated by the mathematical detail. So, what seems to be missing, indeed, is a book that combines these two extremes: a book that cares about conceptual issues but at the same time provides enough mathematical details to enable the reader to understand and judge for herself even the more densely technical material.

Laloë's book (at least partially) fills this gap. His goal is explicitly to understand the foundations of quantum theory which also, by his admission, is something that has been neglected in the majority of traditional physics books on the topic. Not having a clear grasp of its foundations, writes Laloë, makes quantum mechanics a "colossus with feet of clay" (p. xi): how can we properly understand the theory and its implications if we do not understand what it is grounded on? This admission, made by a physicist, is rare and frankly refreshing. While the importance of conceptual issues has been underlined by philosophers all along, physicists have always given them a smug look. Laloë's book seems to show that finally the situation has started to change.

The book has eleven Chapters and several appendices, through which the author goes from the history of quantum mechanics to its interpretations, passing through the Schrödinger cat, the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) paradox and Bell's theorem; quantum entanglement and its application; and a solid mathematical introduction. More in detail, chapter 1 discusses the history of quantum mechanics with accuracy and balance, from the "prehistory" (Planck's oscillators, Bohr's atomic model, Heisenberg's matrix mechanics), to the "undulatory period" (the contributions of de Broglie, Debye and Schrödinger), to the emergence of the Copenhagen interpretation (the developments of Born, Bohr, Heisenberg, Jordan and Dirac). Particular importance is given to the role and status of the state vector. In this regard, two extreme positions are analyzed: first, the view that the state vector describes the physical properties of a system, and second the view that the state vector represents just the information that an observer has about the system.

Laloë rejects both views, calling them "two opposite mistakes" (p. 13). While his reasons for rejecting the latter view are the traditional ones and therefore not controversial, in my opinion his reasons for rejecting the former are too hasty. In fact the first option is dismissed right away by the author as follows: "the difficulties introduced by this view are now so well-known . . . that nowadays few physicists seem to be tempted to support it" (p. 13). Also: "it didn't take long before it became clear that the completely undulatory theory of matter also suffered of serious difficulties, actually so serious that physicists were soon led to abandon it." The main problem identified by the author for this view is that in a many-particle system the state vector would live in configuration space, and this makes it, in the opinion of the author, obviously the wrong candidate to represent matter. While I happen to agree with Laloë's conclusion, the issue cannot be dismissed that quickly. There is an ongoing debate within the philosophy of physics community exactly about whether it is possible, if not even advisable, to regard quantum mechanics as a theory about the wave function, intended as a material field on configuration space, and the issue is far from having been settled.

Be that as it may, chapter 2 correctly and exhaustively discusses the fundamental conceptual difficulties of quantum theory (from the Schrödinger cat, to Wigner's friend, to the role of decoherence), while chapter 3 is a very informative presentation of the EPR "paradox." The author uses many nice illustrative examples to clarify the main premises, the logic and the conclusion of the EPR argument, making the chapter an incredible resource for both physicists and philosophers. Chapters 4 and 5 are dedicated to Bell's theorem and nonlocality. The premises of the theorem and the the logic of the argument are made extremely clear and straightforward, something rarely found in the literature. The theorem is discussed in its many formulations -- from Bell's original 1964 theorem, to the Bell-Clauser-Horne-Shimony-Holt (BCHSH) inequalities, to the formulations of Wigner, Mermin, Greenberg-Horne-Zeilinger (GHZ), Cabello, Hardy, Bell-Kochen Specker -- and Laloë correctly notes that what is at stake is locality and not determinism. The discussion is so complete that the author even covers some of the attempts to bypass Bell's conclusion that reality is nonlocal, discussing the so-called "free will," "counterfactuality" and "contextuality" assumptions.

Chapter 6 is devoted entirely to the purely quantum property of entanglement, including a discussion of origin of quantum correlations. This is a more technical chapter, in which master equations and density operators are introduced, including a discussion of the evolution of subsystems. The following chapter is dedicated to the many applications of entanglement: from quantum cryptography to teleportation, from quantum computation, quantum gates and quantum algorithms to quantum error correction codes. Chapter 8 returns to a more technical and formal presentation, discussing the notions of "quantum measurement:" from the notions of direct and indirect measurement to those of weak and continuous measurement. Then the book presents experiments to illustrate typical quantum properties, such as quantum reduction in real time, single ion or electron in a trap, number of photons in a cavity and spontaneous phase of Bose-Einsetin condensates. Finally chapter 10 addresses the issue of the "interpretations," as Laloë (like many others) calls them. He starts off with the (commonsensical but vague) pragmatist approach, continues with the statistical interpretation (the view that the quantum description only applies to ensembles), moves to Rovelli's relational interpretation (the state vector depends on the observer), to the algebraic approaches and quantum logic, continues with d'Espagnat's veiled reality interpretation (according to which reality is only marginally accessible to us). After a comprehensive and detailed analysis of hidden variables theories like Bohmian and Nelson mechanics, the book continues with a discussion of the modal interpretations, the Schrödinger dynamics of Ghirardi, Rimini, Weber (GRW) and Pearle, Cramer's transactional interpretation (a view which in certain respects reminds one of the Wheeler-Feynman electromagnetic absorber theory), the history interpretations and concludes with the Everett interpretation. The book concludes with a comprehensive and clear mathematical review of the various elements of quantum mechanics.

The book is so dense and full of interesting ideas that many comments could be made. In this review, though, I wish to primarily discuss the main strategy the author uses. Laloë wants to provide a balanced and comprehensive view of the foundations of quantum mechanics; he does not want to give preference to one interpretation or another, to one strategy to another, but rather he wishes to analyze how each of them relate to one another and what their mutual relations and differences are. In fact he writes that his book provides a "balanced view of the conceptual situation" of quantum mechanics (p. xiv). Many would regard this attitude as a strength of the book, since it provides the reader with all the relevant information and tools to decide the issue for herself without being influenced by the opinion of the author. In contrast, I think this strategy may be the weakest trait of the book; this may just be a question of personal taste, but I always find that "neutral" books like this one leave something to be desired. Assuming that I have the means to understand and judge the material independently (which this book is able to provide), I'd rather read a heavily opinionated and provocative book than one in which all the options are stated with an impartial and unbiased attitude. When expressing his own opinion, most commonly an author invariably ends up being more convincing than just merely stating the possible alternatives. Laloë's book seems no exception to this rule. For instance, when the discussion focuses on the attempts to bypass the conclusion of Bell's theorem, Laloë's treatment of the strategies based on the free will assumption, contextuality and counterfactuality is maybe more charitable than needed and sounds a little artificial.

More generally, how can one possibly address all the foundational issues correctly without taking a stand? In other words, taking a particular view to be the case will have consequences: in particular, one view will lead to certain problems, another view to others. For instance, if one thinks that Bohr's theory is correct, then the notion of measurement will be a crucial part of quantum mechanics. But if instead another "interpretation" is believed to be the correct one, the importance and the role of measurement in this theory will be fundamentally different than in the previous one. How can one discuss, say, the notion of measurement in quantum mechanics in general? When in chapter 8 Laloë claims that the notion of measurement is important in quantum mechanics, what does he have in mind? How can we decide what is being measured if we don't already have a clear idea what the ontology of the theory is? As Einstein once reminded us, it is the theory that decides what is being measured. In other words, how can we make a theory of measurement without a clear understanding of the "interpretation" of the formalism? Therefore, I find particularly odd that the chapter on interpretations is left at the end of the book.

Indeed, I find it misleading that these alternatives are actually called "interpretations"; each of them provides a distinctive picture of reality and because of this each of them should be called "theory" instead of "interpretation." Apart from the terminological point, it seems to me that only once a theory is chosen can one then discuss what concepts are relevant and what problems need to be addressed within the context of that theory. If we leave the question of ontology at the end, one may be led to believe that all theories have the same problems simply because they have the same -- or similar -- mathematics (the state vector, the Schrödinger equation and so on), and this would be a mistake. So, to conclude, while I find Laloë's book to be an extremely valuable contribution to the foundations of quantum mechanics for its completeness and clarity of exposition, I still find unsatisfactory its lack of an opinionated discussion and evaluation of the different alternatives.