Does Anything Really Matter?: Essays on Parfit on Objectivity

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Peter Singer (ed.), Does Anything Really Matter?: Essays on Parfit on Objectivity, Oxford University Press, 2017, 300pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199653836.

Reviewed by Andrew Sepielli, University of Toronto


This is a volume of essays on meta-ethical themes from Derek Parfit's magisterial book On What Matters. It boasts an impressive list of contributors, most of whom, we learn from Peter Singer's introduction, were chosen because Parfit saw fit to criticize their views at length. Predictably, then, most of them are established "big names", and many of their essays are defensive in character. As a result, the volume is a bit too intellectually conservative to meet the editor's stated goal of "reinvigorat[ing] discussions of objectivism in ethics". Nonetheless, it helps to clarify these discussions, and to bring out the deeper concerns that animated Parfit's bold and at times controversial stances in meta-ethics.

Several of the essays respond to Parfit's arguments against moral naturalism -- in particular, his contention that if naturalism were true, moral claims could not state substantive truths. Now, we may agree with Parfit when it comes to crude versions of analytical naturalism, on which "is right", say, simply means "maximizes happiness". But Parfit means to target what he calls "non-analytical" naturalism as well, for he regards triviality as a metaphysical rather than a conceptual matter: no moral claim is substantive unless it ascribes an "irreducibly normative property". Since the naturalist does not believe in such properties, she must either say that moral claims are false (if, as Parfit suspects, they ascribe irreducibly normative properties), or non-substantive (if they don't).

A striking set of claims. Where do the contributors think it goes wrong? Peter Railton's essay is the one most squarely devoted to this question. He offers an alternative, naturalism-compatible account of substantivity. He imagines some concepts as specifying a "complex role or 'job description' to be specified by whatever would satisfy" them. The job description associated with the concept "heat", for example, involves "a capacity to melt solids, turn liquids into gases . . . to produce certain characteristic sensations . . . ". (49) The concept "most reason to do" has a job description, too, says Railton: it plays a privileged role in practical deliberation, and there are certain paradigm cases of its application. The naturalist can say that a moral claim is substantive even if it doesn't ascribe an irreducibly normative property, so long as it can be interpreted as implying that only things with certain natural properties fulfill the relevant role. Railton's paper then takes a more conciliatory turn: the naturalist can countenance "irreducibly normative properties" understood "linguistically", as "mere shadows of predicates"; why aren't these properties enough for Parfit, who, after all, tells us that non-natural normative properties are "non-ontological"?

Frank Jackson's paper is largely devoted to buttressing his well-known argument that, due primarily to the necessary co-extension of moral and some natural properties, we can identify the former with the latter. His response to the triviality objection is similar to Railton's: there are a set of moral claims -- those constitutive of "folk morality", or as Jackson suggests elsewhere, mature folk morality -- and it's the role of the natural properties we identify with the moral ones to make these claims true. When we learn that a moral and a natural property identical, we're finding out which natural property best fulfills this role. Jackson suggests, further, that inquirers have further work to do in discovering which properties realize this role.

Mark Schroeder also touches substantially on Parfit's triviality argument. The most interesting of his responses does not rely on rejecting Parfit's "metaphysical" criterion of substantivity. Drawing on previous work, Schroeder argues that claims about reasons pragmatically imply claims about the weight of reasons. It's the property of being a relatively weighty reason, then, that's the further property we attribute in making an ethical statement, such that the statement counts as substantive by Parfit's lights. Schroeder's paper also includes an instructive discussion of the distinction between what he calls "flamboyant" and "conservative" reductive realism. Schroeder's is the latter view, according to which (a) the moral reduces to the natural, but (b) this reduction should be jettisoned if it turns out (as of course Schroeder thinks it doesn't) that this precludes anything from "really mattering".

Parfit's substantivity/triviality arguments also come in for criticism from Allan Gibbard and Bruce Russell, both of whose papers are largely focused elsewhere. The rejection of these arguments by so many authors in this volume seems to me to represent the disciplinary consensus. I join this consensus as far as it goes, although my view is roughly that debates about, e.g., utilitarianism vs. deontology are non-substantive regardless of whether naturalism is true.

But it's regrettable that this volume fails to include any serious attempts to paint Parfit's controversial criterion of substantivity in more attractive light; perhaps it's not as off-the-wall as some think. For one thing, Parfit does try to show why he is not committed to, e.g., the implausible view that we made no substantive discovery when we learned that water is H20. And there is something to the idea that, in order to be substantive, a statement must purport to furnish the world with "new" stuff, rather than merely carving up conceptually the stuff that was "already there". Such a thought is all the more tempting when the stuff in question is ethical, for we might well think: (1) that a value-free world is one in which nihilism is true; (2) that a claim can be a substantive ethical truth only if, by accepting it, we can vanquish the threat of nihilism; but (c) that the kind of nihilism Parfit and others are (understandably) concerned about survives the "addition" of, well, nothing to a value-free world. As to the naturalists' claim that ethical debates certainly seem substantive even on their view, Parfit can allow that these debates display more "sound and fury" than other trivial debates, but for all that might nonetheless, y'know . . .

Let me move on, though, to two papers that defend views like quasi-realism and expressivism against Parfit's objections. "Parfit on Normative Concepts and Disagreement" by Gibbard fleshes out its author's slogan: "Thinking what I ought to do is thinking what to do". Parfit took issue with this claim, since it seems to collapse the distinction between normative thought and action. Gibbard, in response, tries to put some daylight between the practical intellect and the will in two ways. First, he says that the thought that I ought to do an action issues in that action only in coherent agents -- those whose "normative control systems", as Gibbard calls them, effectively regulate their motivations -- but not in akratic ones. Second, he draws on the primitive idea of a disagreement-in-plan to explain the distinction between two agents simply doing different things and two agents having different thoughts about what to do. Additionally, as I mentioned above, Gibbard's essay includes some probing discussion of Parfit's property-based view of substantivity/triviality.

In his "All Souls' Night", Simon Blackburn shockingly disavows his quasi-realist research program in the face of what he regards as devastating objections from Parfit. I'm kidding. Blackburn's paper, which many readers will recognize as the subject of heated online discussions, offers criticisms too numerous to mention of Parfit's arguments against quasi-realism. The central argumentative device is an analogy between quasi-realism in ethics and the kind of expressivistic treatment of single-case probability claims that Blackburn draws from Frank Ramsey, and that some people associate with more recent work by writers like Seth Yalcin, Sarah Moss, and Eric Swanson. While I generally side with Blackburn in this dispute with Parfit (though not with respect to his too-quick dismissal of Parfit's distinction between "state-given" and "object-given" reasons), I do wish that he had displayed more of an effort to "get inside the heads" of Parfit and others on the opposing bench.

Another, more heterogenous group of essays tackles Parfit's arguments against views according to which ethics is mind-/attitude-dependent. Michael Smith's essay takes issue with Parfit's acceptance of "Reasons Fundamentalism" and his rejection of subjectivism. Smith begins by casting doubt on Reasons Fundamentalism, which holds that the concept of a reason is unanalyzable. But the concept of a reason for belief, Smith tells us, is analyzable. So unless we want to say that "reason" is a "ragbag" concept, we must say that the concept of a practical reason is analyzable, too -- specifically, in terms of the concept of a reason for belief. Smith's proposal goes like this: reasons for action are reasons to believe that the aims advanced by the action are desirable. Desirability, in turn, is analyzed along subjectivist lines; it's a matter of what we would desire if we were fully informed and rational. While Smith's package coheres well and impresses in its ingenuity, I wonder about the initial motivations for it. We're never actually given an analysis of "reason for belief", which makes it tempting to conclude that neither this concept nor that of a reason for action is analyzable, rather than that both are. Nor was I persuaded by Smith's "ragbag" argument. Mightn't the reasons fundamentalist say that what ties the various "reason" concepts together are the constitutive non-inferential roles they have in common -- i.e. in guiding, in rationalizing, in being on one end of the "basing" relation, in halting deliberation, in making explicit our ordinarily tacit endorsements of bits of reasoning, in giving rise to non-cognitive attitudes?

Stephen Darwall defends a limited sort of internalism -- one that ties the moral ought, in particular, to motivation. Drawing on his inventive work on the "second-person standpoint", Darwall argues that it's part of the concept of the moral ought that it applies to an action only if the agent is, barring an excuse, blameworthy for not doing it. In turn, Darwall tells us, an agent is blameworthy only if he is capable of holding himself to account for his action, which he is only if he can be motivated to do it. I had two main concerns about Darwall's paper. First, I wondered why the reasons-externalist couldn't capture the link between blameworthiness and holding-oneself-accountable by saying that an agent who lacked the capacity for the latter would simply be excused. Second, putting aside the soundness of the argument, it wasn't so clear to me that, on the most plausible construal, the requisite capacity is "narrow" or "fine-grained" enough for Darwall's internalism to count as the sort of view that Parfit was concerned to rebut.

Sharon Street's paper is a multi-pronged attempt to shore up "Humean constructivist" positions like hers in the face of Parfit's objections. First, Street rightly suggests that we focus not on internalism as a substantive thesis about reasons, rather than on the "analytic internalism" that Parfit was so eager to attribute to Bernard Williams. Second, she shows -- although it doesn't take much of a showing -- that a position like hers can accommodate the possibility of any given agent's being wrong about what she ought to do. And finally, Street responds to Parfit's objections to her well-known "Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value". Parfit, like many realists these days, wants to argue that evolution is apt to produce beliefs in mind-independent moral truths by relying on the contents of this same class of beliefs. Street claims that this purported explanation is "unacceptable"; it employs the content of a judgment to vindicate the in-question reliability of the process that led to that judgment.

But why is this "unacceptable", exactly? Richard Chappell's paper, one of the three to focus mostly on moral epistemology, offers what we might think of as an elaboration. Parfit was offering what Chappell calls a "substantive explanation" of the truth-conduciveness of evolution; but what Street demands, however, is a "constitutive explanation" -- one that "show[s] how our mental faculties can be reliable merely in virtue of the domain in question". (155) Chappell advises the realist to "simply reject" Street's demand -- that, instead, "we may appeal to all our beliefs, including our particular substantive beliefs within a domain". Maybe. But Street doesn't come off as asking for the impossible. Her own view meets her demand, and we seem to be able to offer constitutive explanations of the reliability of, e.g., our faculties to perceive ordinary objects. We would find it mysterious if we couldn't offer them in the latter case, and would adjust our confidence downward accordingly. My question for Chappell: what makes the domain of ethics different, in this respect, than that of "middle-sized dry goods"? In concentrating on this deep dispute with Street, I'm neglecting much of what makes Chappell's paper well worth reading, including an argument that Street-style constructivism is incoherent.

Evolutionary debunking is also the focus of Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek and Peter Singer's contribution. The authors offer a response on Parfit's behalf to the kind of skepticism encapsulated in Henry Sidgwick's famous "dualism" about practical reason -- namely, that there do not seem to be any grounds for assigning impartial moral reasons precedence over those of self-interest. Lazari-Radek and Singer argue that the latter, but not the former, fall victim to debunking arguments like Street's. Rather, the authors claim, impartial moral truths are best thought of as ascertainable by an evolutionary advantageous general faculty of reason. But I worry that without saying more about the nature of this faculty and how it enables access to moral truths, the authors have done little to explain how natural selection could bequeath to us reliable access to them.

Bruce Russell's paper is entitled "A Defense of Moral Intuitionism", but that doesn't do justice to its scope. Russell addresses everything from the nature of intuitions, to the expressivist theory of epistemic discourse, to the significance of moral disagreement, to the fate of Parfit's attacks on moral naturalism. Some of these arguments do not succeed. I'm thinking primarily of Russell's attempt to show that expressivists are committed to relativism, as they hold that things are right or wrong only with respect to a standard -- i.e. the kind of standard acceptance of which one expresses in using moral language. But others are plausible and powerful. Here I'm thinking mainly of Russell's attempt to defang the threat to intuitionism posed by disagreement, and his charge that certain sorts of synthetic ethical naturalism are defective for being inconsistent with our having a priori knowledge of various commonplace, necessary moral truths.

Finally, there were two papers on topics other than the aforementioned. Andrew Huddleston's "Nietzsche and the Hope of Normative Convergence" addresses Parfit's attempts to minimize the concerns he believed were raised by Nietzsche's disagreement with him on issues like the (dis)value of suffering and the significance of inequality. Huddleston succeeds in presenting Nietzsche as a more genuine and formidable foe than Parfit would like him to have been, leading me to think that Parfit ought to have instead jettisoned the assumptions that led him to regard Nietzsche's contrary opinions as a threat in the first place. Putting that aside, though, perhaps Parfit could have said something like this: Nietzsche's driving concern as a normative theorist was not with which value-systems are correct, but with which are good for us to adopt and promulgate. So we might regard most, if not all, of Nietzsche's denunciations of the "morality of pity" not so much as assertions that it is incorrect, but instead as attempts to express, either straightforwardly or obliquely, his view that it is disvaluable.

I close with the very first paper in the volume, Larry Temkin's "Has Parfit's Life Been Wasted? Some Reflections on Part Six of On What Matters". Temkin's essay contains some astute "reflections" on Parfit's rejection of internalism, and on his claim that, while we can be responsive to non-natural reasons, these reasons nonetheless can't cause our responses (or anything else, for that matter). I was most taken by Temkin's arguments that Parfit did not waste his life -- and in particular, with the argument that introduced a contrast between two ways of carving up the meta-ethical theory-space. As Parfit sees things, either some form of non-naturalist externalist moral realism is true, or something tantamount to nihilism is true. Temkin offers a more fine-grained lay-of-the-land: "Between very strong, robust . . . values and very pale, weak . . . values that are basically akin to the nihilistic view . . . , many other types of values are possible ranging in their degree of strength and robustness." (29) Temkin illustrates the possibility of intermediate strength, robustness, and paleness by surveying some views according to which values are mind-dependent, non-universal, and/or contingent.

But what are these notions of strength and robustness regarding which Temkin takes himself to be disagreeing with Parfit? They're not the usual meta-ethical fare of mind-dependence, truth-aptness, reduction, and so on. They seem rather to be (with apologies to Raymond Carver) what we care about when we care about the objectivity of values. They're what's possessed by views that "guard the underprivileged against nihilism . . . by placing each in an order that [does] not agree with the worldly order of rank and power" (Nietzsche 1901: 37); they're what's missing in views that tend to leave us with the unenlivening picture of the universe as cold, indifferent, disenchanted, "atoms in void". And indeed, I suspect they're more-or-less what Parfit had in mind when he queried in such urgent tones whether anything "really matters", and drew the lines of substantivity in the "metaphysical" way that perplexed so many of his peers.


Nietzsche, Friedrich. 1901. The Will to Power, trans. Hollingdale and Kaufman, ed. Kaufman, 1968. Vintage.