Does Perception Have Content?

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Berit Brogaard (ed.), Does Perception Have Content?, Oxford University Press, 2014, 377pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199756018.

Reviewed by Gabrielle B. Jackson, Stony Brook University


I watch my two-year-old daughter quietly gazing off the deck of the ferry. She is looking toward the water. Off to the right, still in her field of vision, is the last reach of land, a small peninsula, where trees line the ridge and houses occupy the sandy shore. To her left is nothing but ocean and sky and the occasional bird. I wonder, what does she see? Come to think of it, what do I see?

As soon as the reverie ends, the academic in me (not to be outdone) asks the same questions, but in the technical language of philosophy: "What is conveyed to the subject by perceptual experience?" Perceptual experience has "phenomenal character." There is "something it is like" to perceive. This much seems right. But what exactly is given to the subject by perceptual experience, if anything at all?[1] Does my daughter see trees and birds, blues and greys? She must. But does she see them as birds or as blues? Unlike me, she does not yet know the words "seagull" or "cerulean." Do I see a seagull where she sees a bird? What overlap is there, if any, between what is presented in our perceptual experiences? Within the philosophy of perception, answers to these questions are abundant, prismatic, and at times inscrutable. And their interface constitutes the debate about perceptual content.

Berit Brogaard's edited volume proceeds by presenting us with a selection of views of what perception does, or does not, convey to the perceiver, how it is given, and what is taken.[2] The contributors are respectful of rival views, and many are dutifully humble in their positive and negative assertions. The book, however, is only for a unique subset of readers: those who are already enmeshed in the perceptual-content debate within analytic philosophy and looking for fearsomely defensible positions and well-wrought arguments. It is not really for newcomers. What the volume does well is give us a sampling of the state of the art today.

I did find myself asking, on more than one occasion, what exactly is at stake as we refine these positions and arguments -- for empirical science, for our conception of ourselves and others in the world, and for the role of perception in our lives and in its relation to cognition, emotion, and action? Answers to those questions were not readily forthcoming. There were a few exceptions. Mohan Matthen's " Image Content" furnishes an exemplary, broad perspective. He begins with a brief history of how western (analytic) philosophy came to the view that perceptual experience has content, a view based on natural assumptions about the relations among appearances, perception, and knowledge. As the story goes, our senses generate images, these images enable us to perceive the world, and these perceptions allow us to know things. This would seem to imply that, as Matthen puts it, "the perceiving subject is presented with a proposition -- the proposition that the world is a certain way. This proposition is often entitled the content of a perceptual state" (265). But he explains that the path traversing appearance, perception, and knowledge has rifts that must be filled. "There is no discussion of how an opinion can interact with an image," he laments (266). And this lacuna -- the missing translation between stimulus and sense -- supplies the space to be filled by Matthen's analysis of perceptual content (more on his view later). Perhaps it is unreasonable to wish, of a highly technical book, that all the contributors give compelling provocation for their views, as Matthen does. But philosophers working on such uncommon ground might want to point out the footing better, for the rest of us, before they begin to grapple.

The volume contains 14 distinct contributions, and is divided into five parts: in favor of perceptual experience having content ("strong content views"), against perceptual experience having content ("weak content views"), intermediate views, alternative views to this strong-to-weak spectrum, and the constituents and roles of perceptual content.

Brogaard does a remarkable job of summarizing all the chapters in her introduction. This turned out to be a most valuable part of the book, to which I returned many times. The introduction transforms the book from a rather picaresque collection of articles into a coherent itinerary by connecting authors, views, arguments, and concepts. In what follows, I offer my own glosses on the individual chapters. These are not summaries of the positions presented or the arguments offered (not wishing to duplicate Brogaard's hard work) but notices of what I take to be powerful ideas from each chapter.

In Part One: Content Views, we find defenses of the view that perception has content. In "Looks, Reasons, and Experiences," Kathrin Glüer argues for perceptual experiences being propositional attitudes. Bence Nanay presents some empirical challenges to the view that perception does not have representational content in the chapter "Empirical Problems with Anti-Representationalism." For example, Nanay reports that if you see one flash in your visual field at the moment in which you hear two beeps, then you will see two flashes. He supposes that this phenomenon is an instance of the multimodality of perception -- whereby information processing from one sense modality (e.g., audition) affects the information processing from another sense modality (e.g., vision). Nanay argues that this requires matching two representations from the different sense modalities at early stages in perceptual processing. But "if we cannot talk about perceptual representation, how we can we talk about what is being matched?" (46). The content of perceptual experience must be representational.

In "Affordances and the Contents of Perception," Susanna Siegel also supports the view that the content of perceptual experience is representational and extends this interpretation to affordances, or features of the environment that solicit actions from the perceiver. In other words, she claims that affordances -- along with other features of the environment like color, smell, texture -- are represented in the content of perceptual experience. It is important to situate Siegel's thesis against the scholarly background that, for the most part, affordances have been used as evidence against strong content views. For example, many theorists claim that the properties of affordances are more properly at variance with the properties of representations.[3] Seeing the ocean as affording swimming -- viz., as soliciting you to strip down and jump in -- is both organism specific and situation-dependent, unlike representations, whose content is context-independent (there may be other incompatibilities, too). Nevertheless, Siegel attempts to make the case that there is nothing in principle about affordances (or "experienced mandates," as she calls them) that would prevent them from being represented in perceptual experience (52).

In Part Two: Against Strong Content, we find different defenses of the view that perception lacks content. Mark Johnston argues in "The Problem with the Content View" that strong content views cannot account for how perceptual experiences justify perceptual judgments about the world. In "The Preserve of Thinkers," Charles Travis also argues against the strong content view, taking a different tack and distinguishing among different kinds of representational content (viz. "effect," "auto," and "allo") and demonstrating that effect-representational content -- a causal relation that holds between states of an organism and its environment -- is the best candidate for perceptual content (138-140). If this is correct, Travis notes, then the content of perceptual experience is at best minimally representational, or representational in name only.

In "Disjunctivism, Discrimination, and Categorization," Diana Raffman calls into question a key concept used to establish the strong content view: indiscriminability. She reviews a familiar argument that because veridical, illusory, and hallucinatory perceptual experiences are indiscriminable from one another, they must all have something in common; call it "perceptual content." Raffman claims that this indiscriminability argument runs together two related but distinct notions: "appearing the same," which refers to the presentation of two or more stimuli to an observer who deems them the same based on inspection; and "indiscriminability," which refers to the statistical relation when two or more stimuli appear the same in a significant percentage of pairwise comparisons (162). This terminological distinction more precisely allows description of situations in which, for instance, a subject is able to distinguish Blue1 and Blue2, but is not able to recognize them as Blue1 and Blue2 in more than 75% of pairwise comparisons (i.e., Blue1 and Blue2 appear different, even though Blue1 and Blue2 are indiscriminable); and vice versa, situations in which a subject is unable to distinguish Blue3 and Blue4, but is able to recognize them as Blue3 and Blue4 in more than 75% of pairwise comparisons (i.e., Blue3 and Blue4 appear the same, even though Blue3 and Blue4 are discriminable). Raffman writes:

The upshot, I think, is that we cannot meaningfully talk about whether two experiences could be told apart were they to occur simultaneously or in immediate succession . . . talk of the (in)discriminability of experiences is, in the loose and popular sense, a category mistake (190).

Such concerns work to undermine the indiscriminability argument in favor of strong content. (And there is a general lesson to take away from Raffman's chapter, that the seemingly familiar and unproblematic terms, tools, and methods in the perceptual content debate should be given serious critical consideration.)

In Part Three: Reconciliatory Views, we find articulations of how the perceptual content debate might be predicated on false dichotomies, vaguenesses, or misunderstandings. In "Experiential Content and Naïve Realism: A Reconciliation," Heather Logue argues that naïve realism -- the view that perceptual experience has no content -- may actually be compatible with various versions of the weak (and perhaps even strong) content views. A most interesting move in her piece is to defend the claim that, while the content of a belief formed on the basis of perceptual experience need not tell us what the content of that perception is, it is a reasonable inference (from the content of perception to the content of belief) for the naïve realist to make (235). This idea is related to Susanna Schellenberg's characterization of what she calls the "Association Theory" in "The Relational and Representational Character of Perceptual Experience" (201). Association Theory names the view that every perceptual experience can be associated with (but need not have) propositional content. In other words, sentences can be articulated that describe how the environment seems to the subject without the content expressed by that proposition being a proper part of the subject's perceptual experience. Schellenberg uses this insight to argue for a view that sits somewhere between treating the content of perception as representational and as relational. Benj Hellie also argues against the strong content view in "Love in the Time of Cholera." He claims that "perception" names a causal relation between an organism and an environment, in his words, an "organismal sensitivity to the perceptual surround" (243). Closely connected is "perceptual experience", which names an aspect of the stream of consciousness that is attended to that has content (243). Comparisons across perception and perceptual experience eo ipso cannot have common content, potentially invalidating indiscriminability arguments.

In Part Four: Imagistic and Possible-World Content, we find views that the content of perception is not propositional or representational, but something else. In "What is the Content of a Hallucinatory Experience?" Michael Tye argues that the content of perceptual experiences consists of the set of possible worlds in which the object of my experience exists. What then is the content of hallucinatory experiences? On Tye's view, hallucinations lack type-content but have token-content (304). In "Image Content," Matthen argues that the content of perceptual experiences is imagistic and is expressed by existentially quantified propositions of the form <sortal S, feature F, location L> (i.e., these contents express a type of situation in which "an object of sortal type S instantiates feature F occupies location L") (272). An interesting upshot of his view seems to be that we cannot have perceptual experiences of absences (e.g., holes, gaps, syncope). The content of perceptual experience consists in only what exists, with simple features, in that location. So if I seem to see a hole in the floorboards, it is because I see the visual boundaries upon which a judgment is made, namely, that there is an absence where there should be a presence. On Matthen's view, this absence cannot be constituted in the content of the perceptual experience.

In Part Five: The Constituents of Perceptual Content and the Role of Perception, we find views that attempt to specify the components of perceptual content and the relation of perception to other forms of experience. In "Phenomenal Intentionality and Secondary Qualities: The Quixotic Case of Color," Terry Horgan offers a view that distinguishes perception from cognition in virtue of perception's "phenomenal intentionality," which is a narrow and intrinsic feature of mentality (329). On Horgan's view, the content of perception is narrow and the content of cognition is wide (e.g., brains in vats cannot perceive color, but they can think about it). Tomasz Budek and Katalin Farkas discuss perception associated with different sense modalities, in "Which Causes of an Experience Are Also Objects of the Experience?" They believe that the heavy focus on vision as the paradigm of perception has artificially structured the debate about the content of perception. They suggest that there is no common view about the content of perceptual experience across the senses and perhaps even within a single sense.

William G. Lycan concurs with Budek and Farkas (and many others) in pointing out that vision seems to be the best candidate for having representational content. Other senses (touch, sound, smell, taste, even proprioception) are candidates, too, Lycan claims, though only arguably so. This leads him to point out, at the start of the chapter "What Does Vision Represent?" that we may only think the content of perceptual experience is representational because of our focus on vision, a conclusion drawn from "a very one-sided diet of cases" (311). Lycan even acknowledges the possibility that vision does not represent at all. But, assuming it does represent, Lycan posits that vision may represent many aspects of experience: from low-level properties (e.g. motion, shape, color) to high-level properties (e.g., faces, values, affordances) and perhaps to even stranger things yet. Can "A cloud … be seen as the head of Thomas Eakins" or "a wineglass … be seen as H.M.S. Unspeakable" (321-322)? While Lycan is "reasonably sure" we do not represent the cloud as a head or the wineglass as a ship in perceptual experience, he admits not being able to defend his reasonable assurance against the rhetorical question: if seeing a cloud as a head is visual and not cognitive, then how is seeing the cloud as a head not visually representing the cloud as a head (322)? By the end of his chapter, Lycan asserts that there seems to be no clear line between perception and cognition and so no straightforward way to settle whether the content of perception could also be the content of cognition -- that is, to what extent there is "cognitive penetration" in perceptual experience (326). This leads Lycan to conclude with something of a conundrum: "Aspect perception seems thoroughly visual; interpretation happens; but the interpretation involves cognitive penetration without being purely cognitive" (326). And so he leaves us without definitive answers to the question of what vision does (or does not) represent.

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When reflecting on perceptual experience, it certainly might seem to us that it has this or that content. But what does this conclusion have to do with the perceptual experience we had (must have had?) prior to reflection? This concern about the perturbations effected by reflection on perception is one of the deepest insights we owe to the phenomenological tradition and is arguably its methodological foundation.[4] I was surprised how little attention was paid to this relevant concern in the more than 300 pages of Does Perception Have Content?  Hellie distinguishes between sensitivity to the environment and those experiences as they manifest in the stream of consciousness. Both Logue and Shellenberg concede there is no guarantee that the content of a perceptual experience is the same as the content of the judgment based on that experience. Johnston articulates a similar worry in the preamble to his chapter when he writes,

as philosophers of perception we need to understand the experiential condition of the perceiving subject as it stands prior to the subject going on to judge, 'on the basis of' experience, this or that about how things stand in the subject's perceived environment (105).

And Lycan goes further and rightly points out that we must acknowledge the possibility that, in exploring perceptual experience, "attention alters the first-order state, or that it adds content" (319).

It seems quite easy to describe experiences in such a way that they demand a content explanation. (And depending on how you describe the experiences, different content explanations are called for.) Much harder, it seems, to describe experiences in such a way that they do not. Yet I see no way to avoid feeling deeply uneasy at this point. What it suggests to me is that certain descriptions of perceptual experiences surely do require the language of content -- that, indeed, described in a certain way, it is apt to assign 'cerulean' or 'seagull' as representational content -- but that these might not be original features of perception itself. So what will settle whether some description is the right one, especially if these descriptions as a group serve to ground the view of content being espoused? What of the broader concern that perception apart from description lacks content and it is only our attempts to explain it which lead us to think otherwise?

I agree whole-heartedly with Lycan's answer to this question. Much of what we use to adjudicate various positions within this debate can be construed as question-begging by someone else. Introspection, reflection, psychosemantics, misperception, linguistic practice, phenomenal contrast, even phenomenology -- these settle nothing (313-314). But that does not mean we have to accept Lycan's aporetic conclusion: "I can draw hardly any" (326). As he continues:

My main thesis remains, that it is hard to see what could establish a claim as to what vision does or does not represent. Another thing that remains is the possibility that the question is a bad one. All this, I fear, is grist to the mill of the skeptics who deny that vision represents in the first place. I probably should not have written this chapter (326).

I am glad he did -- remaining hopeful that though we may have settled nothing, we are gradually advancing towards something.

[1] In other language: what exactly is presented, represented, intended, or predicated to the subject in or through perceptual experience or perception.

[2] Different options for what the content of perceptual experience is include, but are not limited to: representational content, propositional content, and phenomenal content.

[3] For example: Hubert Dreyfus, "Intelligence without Representation," Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences 1(4): 367-383 (2002); Shaun Gallagher, "Are Minimal Representations Still Representations," International Journal of Philosophical Studies 16 (3): 351-369 (2008).

[4] "Phenomenological" gets used in analytic philosophy to describe what an experience is like. For example, Siegel writes: "If the [tennis] court, or the things in it, or the situation on the court didn't look any way to you at all, then you would not be seeing them. (Even if you are hallucinating rather than seeing, the same basic phenomenological point holds)" (62). The point being that: when you are seeing (or hallucinating) things look a certain way, and when you are not seeing (or hallucinating), things don't look any way. "Phenomenological" appears, with more or less similar usage, throughout this book (e.g., in the chapters by Brogaard, Glüer, Shellenberg, Hellie, Matthen, Lycan, Horgan, Budek and Farkas). This use is terminologically restrictive, ignoring its original (and also current) meaning in the continental tradition owed to Edmund Husserl -- namely, the method of describing the invariant structures and features of different types of experiences in a way that is undisturbed by reflection, introspection, or judgment. Considering its quite specific use in this book, the term "phenomenal" seems more appropriate.