Does Socrates Have a Method' Rethinking the Elenchus in Plato's Dialogues and Beyond

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Scott, Gary Alan, Does Socrates Have a Method' Rethinking the Elenchus in Plato's Dialogues and Beyond, Penn State University Press, 2002, 327pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 027102173X.

Reviewed by David K. O'Connor, University of Notre Dame


The answer to the title question given by the twelve essays (and two of the four commentaries) in this loosely organized volume is, “No”. A little academic history will make clearer how this answer contributes to current scholarly debates within ancient philosophy.

The title question arises from the influential work of the late Gregory Vlastos, especially his article “The Socratic Elenchus.” This article was the second paper in the inaugural volume of Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy in 1983. The honor of the lead paper went to the then recently deceased G.E.L. Owen. Thus OSAP’s first two papers came from the post-war era’s two most influential paradigm-makers in Anglophone studies of ancient philosophy. The OSAP editors’ opening statement voiced their hope that the new journal would continue what it characterized as “their tradition.”

With Vlastos’ paper, at least, the OSAP’s editors made a prescient choice. Aided by his indefatigable and generous work with younger scholars, both with graduate students and in NEH summer seminars, Vlastos had a wide influence on how Plato was read. Not that all were convinced by his solutions. But very many were pulled into the orbit of his distinctive questions and read Plato with a view to “out-Vlastosing Vlastos.” And to do this, one read the often puzzling statements of the Platonic Socrates as if they were generated by a kind of depth grammar of Socratic theoretical commitment. Analysis of Plato’s early dialogues proceeded by reconstructing Socratic theories, or at least coherent sets of Socratic epistemic commitments, that would generate Socrates’ specific arguments. This approach to reading Plato depended on the rather optimistic belief that Plato had, or at least had intended, to give us readers of his Socratic dialogues enough linguistic data to construct the Socratic generative grammar.

One could apply this research paradigm to exploring implicit Socratic theories of particular ethical values – love, justice, courage, piety, law-abidingness – and Vlastos and those he influenced certainly did much work of this kind. Terence Irwin’s Plato’s Ethics (1995) is perhaps the single most impressive achievement of such research. Vlastos himself thought of Socrates as essentially a moral philosopher, and so as aware of the depth of theory that generated his particular ethical statements and arguments. But Vlastos’ research paradigm did not depend on this sort of theoretical self-consciousness. It could also provide the framework for readings that aimed to reconstruct the generative theories in philosophical areas where Socrates never focused his attention, but that were still implicit in his practice.

Vlastos himself had since the 1950s been fascinated with the idea that Plato’s Socrates had a distinctive method of argument, not merely a distinctive set of ethical views, even though Socrates never raised this implicit methodology to the level of conscious examination. Vlastos tenaciously attempted to reconstruct what Socrates must have presupposed to deploy this method, a method Vlastos dubbed “the elenchus,” following the lead of the pioneering work of Richard Robinson. As Gary Alan Scott reports in the editor’s introduction to the volume under review, “Vlastos thought that ‘the problem of the elenchus’ consisted in the question why Socrates and his interlocutor abandon the original hypothesis put forth in answer to one of Socrates’ patented ‘What is X?’ questions and embrace its negation, when the original hypothesis has not really been refuted but only shown to be inconsistent with other premises held (or put forth) by the interlocutor” (3).

There are three sorts of disagreement one might have with Vlastos’ elenchus project. First, one might accept his general research paradigm, and accept its application to Socratic method, but differ from Vlastos about the correct generative theory of elenchus. None of the volume’s essays takes this position.

The second alternative is to accept (or at least not reject) Vlastos’ general paradigm, but deny that it can be successfully applied to analyzing Socrates’ method s of argument. This is the position developed in various ways by the six essays in the first half of the volume, well summarized in the characteristically clear and vigorous commentary by Thomas Brickhouse and Nicholas Smith, “The Socratic Elenchos?”. They all contribute to the overall impression that Socrates’ methods are simply too diverse, and Plato’s focus on their structure too episodic, to provide the sort of data needed to do a Vlastosian reconstruction of their generative depth grammar.

The first essay, James Lesher’s “Parmenidean Elenchos”, hardly belongs in the volume at all, but it does bring out the variety of meanings that the word elenchos had acquired in philosophical contexts before Socrates’ time. In “Forensic Characteristics of Socratic Argumentation,” Hayden Ausland shows something similar for the competitive oratory of Socrates’ own time, especially in the lawcourts. The evidence he assembles makes it harder to identify a uniquely Socratic method of argument, since the verbal maneuvers dramatized in the dialogues are so often paralleled elsewhere in the contemporary rhetorical culture. In his contribution, Harold Tarrant, simply by assembling word tables that show how little Plato uses words such as elenchos, casts suspicion on interpretations that make “the problem of the elenchus” central to Plato’s Socrates. In their “Variety of Socratic Elenchi,” Michelle Carpenter and Ronald Polansky provide an especially damaging blow to Vlastos’ elenchus project by giving a careful account of the great variety of ends served by Socratic refutations in the dialogues. Hugh Benson and Mark McPherran complement this line of argument in compact presentations of positions they have developed in their recent books

Third, one can disagree with Vlastos by directly rejecting his research paradigm and its mode of reading, and try to read the dialogues in some other way. This is the position of the essays in the second half of the volume, though they do not converge on some one alternative interpretive approach. Here the individual essays, it seems to me, must simply stand on their own, since they do not particularly complement one another or converge. Insofar as most of them share a tendency, it is to emphasize the ways Socrates’ arguments are tailored to the specific interests, fears, and virtues and vices of his interlocutors. In a word, these interpretations place protreptic at the center of the Socratic dialogues. Here I am rather sympathetic to Lloyd Gerson’s discreet suggestion in his commentary that these essays are not among “the more substantial works in a similar vein” (218) that one might read. Indeed, as with some of the essays in the first half, the more substantial versions could be sought among other publications of these very scholars.

Francisco Gonzalez focuses on Euthydemus and Clitophon (which he regards as inauthentic), François Renaud on Lysis; and Charmides is the focus of W. Thomas Schmid, Gerald Press, John Carvalho, and Joanne Waugh’s commentary. P. Christopher Smith provides a quite different sort of essay, on Philebus, developing Gadamer’s approach, which focuses on the limits of any attempt to find stable or at any rate final doctrines in the dialogue. Gerson’s commentary on the non-Lysis essays is a strongly worded challenge to the focus on protreptic, for he sees it coming at the expense of a focus on the doctrines Plato surely meant to convey through the dialogues. Even more is he impatient of the whiff of deconstruction hovering about Smith’s essay. To Gerson, such interpretive strategies erase the difference “between Plato and the Sophists who are consistently reviled and execrated in the dialogues” (219). Readers who enjoy this sort of thing are likely to enjoy his further impatience with the particular essays. But the impatience is more that between two people with different research paradigms, than of two people who share enough to have a fruitful debate.

Overall, then, this volume’s most useful contribution is gathering together the essays in the first half that put Vlastos’ elenchus program to the test.