Doing Aesthetics with Arendt: How to See Things

Placeholder book cover

Cecilia Sjöholm, Doing Aesthetics with Arendt: How to See Things, Columbia University Press, 2015, 219pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231173087.

Reviewed by Casey Haskins, Purchase College


Cecilia Sjölholm aims "to trace a coherent line in Arendt's considerations of art and aesthetics in and through the scattered remarks on aesthetic experience and art in her published works, notes, and letters, and . . . to make her thoughts relevant for us today." (ix) Both goals are challenging, given that Arendt never produced an aesthetic theory of her own. She had little interest in current developments in aesthetic theorizing or in the late twentieth-century art world, which by the sixties was well into the early phase of postmodernism. Her theoretical reading in aesthetics went little further than Kant's Critique of Judgment, and the conceptual roots of her high-modernist vision of culture lay more in the eighteenth than the twentieth century. Yet, as Sjöholm shows in detail, aesthetic themes frame many of Arendt's seminal arguments about political plurality, freedom, and community and the threats to these ideals from modern totalitarianism and anti-Semitism, as set out in The Human Condition, The Life of the Mind, her well known essay "The Crisis in Culture," and other writings.

Sjöholm's framing metaphor of "seeing things" refers to Arendt's conviction that people cannot be led to think clearly about, let alone attain, ideals of genuine political community and freedom by unaided rational argument. They need to perceive and feel the rightness of certain specific modes of association in ways analogous to how we perceive and feel the beauty or aesthetic rightness of an artwork or other aesthetic object or situation. Arendt accordingly considered political thought to be epistemologically akin to aesthetic criticism in that it reflects specific ways in which people reflectively judge, or "see" their political circumstances in diverse cultural and historical settings. Hence her interest in Kant's third Critique, a book often cited as a source for later modernist doctrines of apolitical aesthetic formalism but which, she was convinced, contained the seeds of a political theory within its investigation of the transcendental bases of taste.

The five chapters begin with a discussion of the ontological role of plurality in constituting a public sphere. Human beings, for Arendt, are not bound together by participating in a universal human essence. What there are instead are a plurality of particular human individuals, and an adequate account of political life will emphasize that it arises out of the behavior of individuals. There is no single concept that captures all the ways human beings seek freedom. We come to know the different ways we do and fail to do this only through the appearances of embodied individual human beings in actual historical experience and in the products of artistic imagination. An acknowledgment of these forms of human differentiation energizes open and free societies, whereas it is just this acknowledgment, along with the social space to enact our differences, that totalitarianism represses. Against this background, Arendt regarded artworks as ontologically special forms of appearance which enjoy an autonomy from the world of cause/effect and means/end relationships that make human beings moral, rationally fallible, and susceptible to political manipulation. As she wrote in "The Crisis in Culture,"

From the viewpoint of their durability, artworks are superior to all things; since they stay longer in the world than anything else, they are the only things without function in the life process of society; strictly speaking, they are fabricated not for men, but for the world which is meant to outlast the life-span of mortals, the coming and going of generations.

Art's "durability" -- Arendt's term for explanatory and justificatory autonomy of a sort common in mid-twentieth century humanistic writing -- entails that artworks can condition cultural life, rather than, as some Marxist analyses would have it, be just symptomatic expressions of nonartistic forces. Yet while the meanings of artworks and their processes of production and reception float free of facts about politics, art can nonetheless indirectly serve the political end of increasing community. Artworks are what Arendt called "thought things" -- hybrids of spirit and material object which express ideas that elude easy discursive formulation. This concept draws upon the Kantian theme of ideas that cannot be directly experienced:

A thought-thing is produced through the defiance of the fleeting character of thought process, allowing for a certain appearing attachment. Such a thought-thing may appear to give only a secondary importance to formal and sensible qualities. Thought-things induce our will to go beyond appearances. What transpires in the end, however, is a thought that can never be conceived as wholly and duly abstract. It is, however, liberated from the coercing force of concepts. (51)

(This sounds like a variation on Kant's theme in the third Critique of the beautiful object which "symbolizes morality" through its indirect presentation of an idea of reason.) Sjöholm is a little vague about Arendt's own favored examples of thought things in art. Perhaps Arendt saw this dynamic at work in her favorite twentieth century fictional writers such as Kafka, Dinesen, and Faulkner. Sjöholm suggests that some well known works by artists known for their intellectualized interpretations of their own work -- Joseph Kosuth, John Cage, Yvonne Rainer, and others -- fit the bill.

A later chapter addresses the aesthetic dimension of "realness," understood not as a stylistic feature of art but as general phenomenological fact, a quality in objects that appears "when the senses are cooperating." Arendt's thinking here draws upon the Kantian theme that our experience of any appearing object as empirically real is constituted through the synthesizing activities of our minds. Echoing Kant's account of beauty, Arendt maintains that we constitute the real phenomenal presence of artworks too, albeit in a more attenuated and cognitively open-ended way than in the non-aesthetic experience of objects. This reflective open-endedness allows for a freedom and variability in individual aesthetic responses to art that affords modern audiences opportunities to imagine and at least work toward creating a "sensus communis" -- the Kantian ideal of social life rooted in and unified by shared taste. In this strand of the third Critique's argument, Arendt famously discerned the outlines of a not-fully-articulated political philosophy.

Another influence on Arendt's aesthetic reflections was, of course, her former mentor Martin Heidegger. Little space is given to this relationship here, although a recurrent motif is the mature Arendt's divergence from Heidegger's interpretations of themes which were otherwise of common interest. For example, both thinkers acknowledged the existential importance of human individuality as always existing in a condition of being-with-others. But whereas Heidegger is interested mainly in the fact that people appear together (Mitsein), Arendt emphasizes that how people and things appear in public space is equally important. Both writers also placed great importance on Greek culture as the source of modern ideas about art and technology. "But what separates Arendt from Heidegger is that she looks at the Greek conception of culture not from the perspective of the violence of metaphysics but rather from the restraint of the law," as staged for example in the stories of Oedipus and Antigone. (116)

Two final chapters address Arendt's views on the political significance of tragedy and comedy. She emphasizes that, like the Greek tragedians, we need today to ground our understanding of basic components of political life such as law and the state by reflecting on how "the appearances of lives" (that is, real configurations of observable human bodies and actions) are produced. Such production takes place when we enact, break, and replace laws in any political setting. It also takes place at another level in our mythic stories about our relationships to laws (including ancient myths of the founding of states such as the story of the Exodus and Virgil's story of Aeneas' journey to Rome), and also in tragedy. Arendt found the tragedies of Sophocles particularly suggestive for their depiction of how in certain situations (such as those of political exile, including the history of Jewish exile leading to the founding of the modern Jewish state) human beings are forced to act in fateful ways without an ability to predict consequences. Tragic action, in this sense, Sjölolm notes, needs for Arendt to be read "against the backdrop of political freedom." (23)

Arendt's comments on the political value of comedy center around the films of Charlie Chaplin. Chaplin was a social progressive whose incarnations of "the little tramp" in films like Modern Times and City Lights condense an array of critical perspectives on what it is for a modern person to experience identification or marginalization within a culture, against the backdrop of modern class struggle racism, and colonization. Like Walter Benjamin and unlike Theodor Adorno, Arendt regarded laughter as a potent vehicle for expressing revolutionary feelings. Chaplin's portrayal of outcast individuals became for her a powerful allegorical counterpart to the theme of "the Jew as pariah," as discussed in a 1944 essay.

These well-documented chapters will be useful for readers seeking an exegetical overview of the fragmentary writings about aesthetic subjects of one of the last century's great political thinkers. But they leave unanswered questions about how to understand these writings' larger value. Sjöholm does not inspire confidence here in commenting that "There was no involvement on the part of Arendt in the philosophy of aesthetics of her time, neither in the work of Adorno nor Arthur Danto nor in the debates surrounding the legacy of Clement Greenberg." (1-2) And puzzlingly, the text and notes contain no substantial quotations and interpretive analyses of Arendtian passages of the sort one might expect in a sustained defense of a writer's positions. Such facts may make readers wonder how seriously Sjöholm herself believes that these fragments have enough substance and originality to make them, as she begins by claiming, "relevant for us today."

How relevant they are depends in part on the interpretation of that last pronoun. A major challenge for aesthetic theorists in the twenty-first century is to find ways of talking about artistic production and reception which are sensitive to how the "us" projected by much modernist-era theory and criticism including Arendt's -- a decontextualized, unified universal sensibility with philosophical roots in German Idealist transcendental psychology -- masks the plural sensibilities, European and otherwise, that provide the real data for postmodern-era cultural conversations. Arendt, for all her concern with "plurality" as an ontological dimension of political selfhood and her acknowledgement that selves are always embodied in particular ways, had little interest in the epistemological and political arguments for pluralism about the norms of taste that aesthetic and cultural theorists now ignore at their peril. This blind spot in her thinking shows up, for example, in what Sjölolm describes as her sometimes racist references to Africans and postcolonial movements.

Arendt, Sjöholm notes, had sympathies for much of the work of Benjamin. But another blind spot in her aesthetic thinking is her lack of interest in the seminal writings of fellow German-Jewish émigrés to America such as Marcuse and Adorno, who did so much to shape the self-critical conversations about art and culture of the sixties and seventies which mutated into theoretical postmodernism. Arendt, Sjöholm notes, shared some intuitive common ground with Adorno about the bleakness of a post-Holocaust, late capitalist civilization pervaded by disenchantments and false consciousness, fueled by what Adorno called the 'culture industry'. But about Arendt's disdain for Adorno's further ideas about, for example, the radical autonomy and dialectically negative functions of advanced art, we learn little more than that she regarded them as "hopelessly unpolitisch." (2) Was it, we wonder, ultimately out of nostalgic attachment to earlier images of de-politicized artistic autonomy that Arendt was put off by the dialectically subtle accounts of art's relation to political praxis in writers like the above? Or did she have more interesting philosophical reasons for this aversion? How would Arendt have defended her vision of artistic "durability" from the familiar Marxist-style criticism that it worries too little about what kinds of content artworks need to promote transformed political consciousness? And how would she respond to a more postmodern-style criticism that her melioristic vision of "durable" canonical art is uncritically Eurocentric?

Given such questions, a better approach might be to simply grant up front that Arendt's aesthetic views (unlike many of her other insights into political life, which remain all too relevant now) were dialectically dated. One could then consider the place of those views within a fuller narrative of late modern debates about the unruly subject of the postmodern-era theme of the "politics of aesthetics." Arendt, purist about art's political and economic autonomy that she in the end was, perhaps would have denied that there is a politics of aesthetics, as opposed to an "aesthetics of politics," on which her insights were original and important. But that denial is itself in fact part of this narrative too. Sjöholm's passing references to the above-mentioned critical theorists as well as more postmodern-era figures (Derrida, Rancière, Butler, Žižek and others) hint at such a narrative's possibility without describing its substance. But this volume is a timely reminder of how broad, and certainly relevant, a phenomenon the aesthetics/politics relationship is, while underscoring the need for a more comprehensive history of its ongoing reinterpretation over the last century which has yet to be written.