Doing and Allowing Harm

Placeholder book cover

Fiona Woollard, Doing and Allowing Harm, Oxford University Press, 2015, 239pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199683642.

Reviewed by Jakob Elster, University of Oslo


The idea that there is a morally relevant distinction between doing harm and allowing harm is one of the core deontological convictions and plays an important role in our common-sense moral judgements. Yet, common as this claim is, doubts can be, and have been, raised about the doing/allowing-distinction. Fiona Woollard seeks to assuage such doubts by first showing exactly what the distinction between doing and allowing amounts to and next providing a defense of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing. Woollard's book is meticulous and solidly argued and should be a natural starting point for future discussions of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing.

Woollard first defines the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing (henceforth: DDA) as "the claim that doing harm is harder to justify than merely allowing harm" (p. 6). But she soon goes on to specify a narrower understanding of the Doctrine. The DDA, she writes, can

imply either (or both) of the following claims:

A.   It is not (generally) permissible to do harm in order to avoid allowing greater harm, because doing harm is harder to justify than merely allowing harm.

B.    There are some costs to the agent, such that it is permissible to allow a given harm rather than suffer that cost, but it is not permissible to do that harm rather than suffer that cost, because doing harm is harder to justify than merely allowing harm. (p. 14)

Woollard concentrates on the second claim, which she takes to be primary. Her defense of this claim involves first (Part I) giving an account of how the distinction between doing and allowing should be understood and next (Parts II-IV) providing an argument why there should be the kind of asymmetry between constraints on doing harm and constraints on allowing harm which the DDA prescribes.

The first and longest section of the book consists in a detailed analysis of the distinction between doing and allowing, which allows us to explain why an agent counts as doing harm rather than allowing harm (or vice versa) in a given case instead of just having to rely on an intuitive application of that distinction.

Central to Woollard's analysis is the notion of a sequence. She argues that we can describe the sequence of facts leading to a harmful outcome, and we can assess whether an agent counts as doing harm or merely as allowing harm by asking if there is "an unbroken series of substantial facts connecting the agent's behaviour to the upshot" (p. 34). If there is, the agent does harm. If one of the facts in the series is non-substantial, the agent only counts as allowing harm. Once this central framework is established, much of the work in Part I consists of establishing what counts as a substantial fact.

Woollard proposes a pluralist account, where a fact can be substantial in several ways. The most important of these is by being a positive fact, an idea which she borrows from Jonathan Bennett and develops further. Positive facts are of two types. First, there are "specificity positive" facts. Woollard's account of these is complex and ingenious, but she nicely summarizes its essence: "positive facts are informative, telling us what did happen, while negative facts are uninformative, telling us merely what did not happen." (p. 53-4).

Next, facts can be positive by being what Woollard calls "scalar positive", which means that something is "above a certain point on a natural scale" (p. 55): that the temperature is over 28 degrees Celsius is thus a positive fact (p. 54). Furthermore, negative facts can be substantial if they are contrary to what Woollard terms "normal presuppositions" about how things are. As Woollard argues, if I kill someone by removing the oxygen from the room he is in, the negative fact that there is no oxygen in the room is nevertheless substantial since it goes against normal presuppositions, and so I count as doing harm to the person in question (pp. 57-58). Finally, facts which are normally non-substantial can, in certain contexts, count as substantial relevant to a certain harmful outcome, as Woollard argues in a fascinating chapter on the removal of barriers to harm. For example, if the barrier to harm belongs to the victim, the absence of the barrier is a relevantly substantial fact.

In Part II, Woollard proposes a justification of the DDA. Her fundamental premise is that our bodies count as belonging to us, in the sense that we have authority over what they are used for. (The argument extends to cover a person's other resources, but Woollard concentrates, especially in Part IV, on the claim that our bodies belong to us.) It follows from this premise that we need protection from other people and their needs laying claim to our bodies: if others could use our bodies or require that we use our bodies to help them whenever their needs exceed our needs, our bodies would not really belong to us. Woollard calls others "[intruding] into another's proper sphere" (p. 98) in this way "imposing on" him/her, and she argues that the DDA provides exactly the kind of protection against harmful imposition which is required in order for our bodies to belong to us.

Woollard distinguishes two kinds of imposition -- "causal imposition" and "normative imposition" -- and argues that the DDA protects us against both kinds. First, the DDA involves a constraint on doing harm. This constraint protects against others causally imposing on us; that is, actually causing us harm in order to protect their own needs. Next, the DDA does not involve an equally strong constraint on allowing harm. If there were a strong constraint against allowing harm, others would, in Woollard's words, "normatively impose" upon us since we would have an obligation to use our bodies (and other resources) to help them. Having authority over our own bodies thus both requires that others cannot legitimately cause harm to us and that others cannot require that we use our bodies to help them. Since the DDA provides the necessary protections, we can justify the DDA by appealing to the fact that our bodies belong to us.

In Part III, Woollard considers a possible objection to her account based on cases where we do have an obligation to help others. Woollard concentrates on Peter Singer's and Peter Unger's arguments that given that we have an obligation to save a drowning child in a pond just next to us, even when this requires us to make a personal sacrifice, we have an obligation to accept an equal sacrifice by donating to charities for saving the lives of (faraway) children. These obligations involve important constraints on allowing harm. If we have such obligations, it might be argued that we do not have the kind of authority over our bodies and other resources which Woollard claims we have.

Woollard's point of departure in responding to this objection is that while our authority over our bodies is important, it is not all that matters morally. Saving strangers in need is also morally important. Woollard further argues that the authority we need to have over our bodies in order for them to belong to us does not have to be absolute: this authority is compatible with a certain level of obligation to aid. We therefore need to identify "the maximal requirement to aid compatible with recognizing that our bodies and other resources genuinely belong to us" (p. 148). In seeking to identify this requirement, Woollard underlines the importance of being "personally involved" in a situation where strangers need help. She argues that since situations in which we are personally involved and have to make sacrifices to save strangers, as in the case of the drowning child, occur only rarely, an obligation to make substantial sacrifices in such cases is compatible with our body and resources belonging to us. By contrast, since occasions to respond to demands for charity in order to help people in faraway places occur often, a requirement to make an important sacrifice in such cases would undermine our authority over our body and resources.

In the final Part, Woollard investigates how her account of the DDA fits with two well-established ethical theories, T.M. Scanlon's contractualism and Brad Hooker's rule-consequentialism. She argues that both theories can use her account of the DDA. The main role of Part IV in the overall argument, however, is to develop a justification for the fundamental premise in Woollard's argument, viz. the view that our bodies genuinely belong to us, a view she dubs "the Body Claim". Woollard discusses three ways of justifying the Body Claim. First, we can take it as a basic claim, in no need for further justification. Next, we can show that accepting the Body Claim will have good consequences since people would not be able to commit to long-term projects if they could not have confidence that the use of their body was up to them. And, as Woollard emphasizes, "The ability to commit to extended projects brings significant material benefits", as well as non-material benefits (p. 190-1).

Thirdly -- and this is Woollard's main argument -- rejecting the Body Claim is, first, disrespectful of others since such a rejection involves denying the moral importance of people's self-understanding as profoundly connected to their body. Next, if we reject the Body Claim, people lack what Woollard calls "full-fledged agency". Full-fledged agency requires the ability to select one's own ends and to act in pursuit of those ends. If our body does not belong to us, we can neither select our own ends nor pursue them over time since we will be obliged to pursue whatever end is dictated by the greater good.

Overall, Woollard provides a compelling argument for the validity of the DDA as well as a rich account of what the DDA involves. She often draws on the work of other philosophers who have worked on the DDA, but she both amends and extends their arguments and ties various strands of argument together. She also often discusses various objections and counter-examples which could be directed against her account. As a result, the book is rich in arguments, counter-arguments and nuances -- much more so than can be done justice to in a short review. It is also full of ingenious and thought-provoking cases.

My main doubt concerning the book's arguments relates to the account of the doing/allowing distinction in Part I and its role in the overall argument. I am not convinced that the account always gives the right explanation of our intuitions, especially when it comes to the third way in which a fact can be substantial: by being contrary to normal presuppositions. The cases Woollard uses to illustrate this form of substantial fact vary in structure. In some of these cases, such as when the leading actor not turning up to a performance ruined the performance, the harm comes about because others act based on the expectation that some fact will obtain when this fact does not obtain. But in other cases, our presuppositions play no causal role, such as when Graeme ruined his teeth by not brushing them (pp. 57-59 for both cases). It is not obvious that these quite different kinds of fact should be assembled under the same category.

Furthermore, it intuitively seems that negative facts can be substantial even when they do not go against normal presuppositions, as in the following variation on one of Woollard's cases:

Almost everyone believes that there is no oxygen in the atmosphere on Mars. This supposition is mostly correct, but as it happens, in one underground cave on Mars there is an air pocket with oxygen where humans can breathe without a space suit. Only Peter knows about this air pocket. One day he notices that his fellow astronaut and sworn enemy, Paul, is trapped in the cave and that the oxygen supply in Paul's space suit is empty. Peter uses a machine to suck the oxygen from the air pocket, thereby killing Paul.

In this case, the absence of oxygen is not contrary to normal presuppositions, and yet Peter clearly seems to be doing harm to Paul. If the absence of oxygen is a substantial fact in this case, it must be explained by something else than by an appeal to our presuppositions.

Another concern I have is whether the account of the doing/allowing distinction given in Part I fits well with the normative defense of the DDA in Parts II-IV. The account of the distinction is driven by a desire to fit our conceptual intuitions as to what counts as a doing or an allowing. It is not given that the result of such an analysis should match exactly the normative constraints which we need in order to be protected from harmful imposition. (Woollard does address this worry on pp. 104-5, but I believe that this problem might require further attention.) This is especially so since Woollard admits that further analysis might show that there are other ways than the ones she discusses in which facts can be substantial. Nothing in her account guarantees that for each new way in which a fact can be substantial, we need the DDA in order to be protected against harmful imposition.

This concern can be illustrated with another case where a fact is contrary to normal presuppositions. Imagine that almost everyone goes to church on Sundays and everyone is expected to do so. Not going to church is thus against normal presuppositions. I, however, do not usually go to church on Sundays, and I do not wish to do so. If I fail to go to church, this counts, on Woollard's account, as a substantial fact, and I might count as having done harm if my failure to go to church is part of a sequence leading to harm. Yet, requiring me to go to church requires me to act differently from how I normally would act, and so a constraint on doing harm would in this case impose on me.

The worry I have raised here does not, however, touch the core argument of the book, only its application to certain kind of facts. The core argument remains, in my view, quite convincing. Woollard shows at what price a rejection of the DDA comes: we can only reject the DDA if we also accept rejecting people's authority over their own bodies. While the book is very useful for those who are inclined to accept the DDA by showing in detail what the doctrine involves and proposing a cogent justification for the doctrine, it will thus also be of help to those who are inclined to reject the DDA by showing what must be argued in order to justify such a rejection.