Doing Philosophy: From Common Curiosity to Logical Reasoning

Placeholder book cover

Timothy Williamson, Doing Philosophy: From Common Curiosity to Logical Reasoning, Oxford University Press, 2018, 154pp., $18.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198822516.

Reviewed by Graham Priest, CUNY Graduate Center, University of Melbourne


People, East and West, have been doing philosophy for some two and a half millennia now; but how do you do philosophy? The answer is anything but obvious. You do not do experiments and analyse statistical data, as in physics; you do not deduce things from axioms, as in contemporary mathematics; you do not go and study archival material, as in history; you do not go on field expeditions, as in anthropology. Moreover, other disciplines tend to be very self-conscious about their methodologies: one will often find courses on methodology in the relevant university departments. Philosophy does no such thing. ('Why?' is itself an interesting question.) So how do you do philosophy.

In the present book, Timothy Williamson gives us his answer to the question. As the cover blurb puts it, 'philosophy begins with common sense curiosity and develops through our capacity to dispute rationally with each other'. There doesn't sound anything much that distinguishes philosophy from other disciplines in this. And indeed, Williamson argues that there is much less difference between philosophy and other disciplines than many have taken there to be. Of course, there must be more to be said than this. So the chapters in this short book elucidate a number of topics: the role of common sense, disputation, clarifying terms, thought experiments, deduction, the role of the history of philosophy, the interpenetration between philosophy and other disciplines, and model building. A brief conclusion ponders whether philosophy will survive against 'cultural prejudices' generated by a failure to understand what philosophy can legitimately offer.

The next thing to be said about this book is that it is not an academic monograph. There are many anecdotes and personal comments. There are no footnotes. A section at the end of the book gives references for further reading (which include, naturally, many references to places where Williamson deploys the methods he endorses). The book is written very much with the lay reader in mind. It comes close in style to books in the Oxford University Press Very Short Introduction series. This is not to say, however, that professional philosophers and students of philosophy will find nothing of interest in the book. On the contrary, Williamson does not mind treading on philosophical toes. Indeed, the style is very much familiar Williamson. He writes in his usual, forthright, take-no-prisoners, style. And those who know his work will recognise many familiar Williamsonian topics.

Turning to matters of substance: I'm very much in agreement with many of the points Willimson makes about methodology, such as the desirability of clarity, the use of imagination and suitably disciplined thought experiments, and the relevance of the history of philosophy to philosophy. Perhaps most notably, both Williamson and I both see philosophy as attempting to answer interesting questions in a disciplined, historically informed, way. (What makes a question philosophical is, however, another touchy question. It is certainly not simply that philosophical questions are more general. The nature of art, for example, is hardly more general than the question of a grand unified theory in physics. Williamson's book does not address that question.) To do this, philosophy formulates theories which answer the questions in different ways; we then select -- fallibly and provisionally -- the theory which stands up best, given the familiar criteria of theory choice, such as adequacy to the data, simplicity, and unifying power. This methodology, as applied to logic, has come to be called 'anti-exceptionalism': logic is no exception to a more general methodology. But Williamson and I would both extend the methodology quite generally: there are no exceptions.

I would not concur with everything in Williamson's picture, however. It is clear to anyone familiar with the writings of Plato, Nietzsche, and the later Wittgenstein, that philosophical styles are many, and I found Williamson's take on philosophy somewhat anglo-centric. We find references to Quine, Kripke, Wittgenstein, and Rawls, but there is no mention of Heidegger, Sartre, Gadamer, or Foucault. Asian traditions do get one look in. Dharmodotta, is cited; but it is unclear that he would have been, had not Gettier made the same point some 1500 years later. (Avicenna on modal logic also gets cited, though since he is working in an Aristotelian tradition, I'd hardly count him as an Asian philosopher.) On p. 143 of the 'References and Further Reading' section, Williamson makes it clear that the book is about "analytic" -- as opposed to "continental" -- philosophy, though the text itself never mentions this qualification; and I, at least, prefer to spread my net of philosophical insight wider.

Next, philosophy, Williamson tells us, starts from common sense, that is, 'what most members in a society know' (p. 8). I'm not sure that it makes sense to say that philosophy starts from anywhere. Since its inception, philosophy (East and West) has been an on-going process. A community of philosophical (or any other) inquirers has no option but to operate from what it takes to be correct; but that is always going to be imperfect. So rationality will be in making appropriate revisions. Rational belief in philosophy, as in any other subject, is, then, situated. But what the relevant community of inquirers holds to be correct may well not be common sense.

Moreover, Williamson sees philosophical method as one of combat (p. 19):

Amongst philosophers, a lecture often matters less than what follows -- 'Q&A', the question-and-answer period. That is when the speaker's arguments and conclusions are put to the test. Questioners propose counter-examples, allege fallacies, discern ambiguities. In response, the speaker fights for the life of her cherished ideas.

Williamson agrees that a Q&A can be carried out in a cooperative fashion, and that the institution of philosophy itself can be thought of as a cooperative enterprise (p. 25), but insists on its 'gladiatorial' (p. 20) nature. Thus, (p. 23):

When two senior philosophers argue some issue out with each other in public, with prestige at stake, it is often clear that neither of them will ever persuade the other; even so, it is not a waste of time if there are uncommitted graduate students in the audience, making up their own minds as to which of the two is having the better of the argument.

This is surely a comment about the way in which philosophy is done in certain places (and at certain times) than about philosophy as such.

Many will find this picture of philosophy unlovely. It cannot be denied that philosophers criticise each other's ideas, and that progress is made in this way. You would have to be blind to miss the point when reading philosophical texts (historical or contemporary, analytic or continental, East or West). But this does not have to be carried out in a confrontational spirit. Philosophical inquiry (whether in the seminar room, pub, or research group) may be, and often is, carried out in a cooperative and collegial, if critical, way.

Let me now take up one issue on which Williamson and I most certainly disagree. This is the hegemony of "classical" logic, particularly with respect to the paradoxes of self-reference. It might seem churlish to complain about Williamson's treatment of the matter in a context in which considerations are deliberately being kept simple; but simple does not have to be misleading.

Williamson and I both agree on anti-exceptionalism about logic. We disagree about what this delivers. First, he overplays his hand concerning the success of classical logic. This, he says (p. 95):

has been more intensively tested than any non-classical logic, and found adequate, since it has been the background logic of mathematics and other sciences for millennia.

Since "classical logic" was invented only around the turn of the 20th Century, the claim seems somewhat anachronistic. At the very least, detailed investigations of theories from the history of science and mathematics would be required to show that their architecture deploys Frege/Russell logic (and in certain of these theories, such as the 18th century infinitesimal calculus, this clearly seems not to be so).

In any case, many non-classical logics can do anything that classical logic can do when augmented with "contingent" assumptions concerning the domain about which we are reasoning. Williamson is alive to this possibility. He says (p. 93):

Arguably, dialetheists underestimate the costs of abandoning classical logic. Since classical logic is tacitly used throughout science, restricting it has a massive knock-on effect. Dialetheists hope to recover classical logic when they need it in non-paradoxical situations on a case-by-case basis, by adding extra assumptions to this effect. "Classical logic is OK in this case". Those assumptions must be added on to all sorts of normal scientific explanations in non-paradoxical situations to make them work without granting the general validity of classical logic. Messing up elegant scientific explanations with numerous extra assumptions made up as one goes along reduces the power of those explanations all over science.

Now, this really is misleading. Adding the assumption of Explosion (everything follows from a contradiction) -- for this is what a classicality assumption amounts to here -- does not 'mess up' the explanation: indeed, it preserves it. Moreover, there are not 'numerous' extra assumptions: there is just one, Explosion (that is, the assumption that the situation is consistent). Admittedly, this assumption has to be made on a case by case basis. But looked at in this way, the postulate of consistency simply becomes an extra postulate of the theory, which can be justified, as can be the rest of the theory, by the standard canons of rational theory-choice. Indeed, this does not even have to be done on a case by case basis. Much reasoning in science and elsewhere is non-monotonic (aka, inductive). If one wishes, one can take the underlying logic of all theories to be the same non-monotonic logic, which takes consistency as a default assumption. Classical reasoning is then automatically forthcoming, unless the rest of the theory forces things to be otherwise.

Nor is this the whole of the story when it comes to dealing with the paradoxes of self-reference, especially the semantic paradoxes. At least in one sense, classical logic is not simpler than paraconsistent logic, or at least LP. For classical logic is the same as LP, except that it adds an extra assumption: that truth and falsity do not overlap. But let this pass. Grant that classical logic is simpler than paraconsistent logic. When it comes to the paradoxes of self-reference, this is not the whole story. For the behavior of truth is also at issue. Now, using a paraconsistent logic allows for a particularly simple formal theory of truth: you have the T-schema, and that's it. One thing we certainly know is that if one sticks to classical logic, the theory of truth, whatever it is, must be more complex than this by several orders of magnitude. It is clear, then, which theory is over-all simplest.

In a different context, Williamson notes and appeals to the Lakatosian notion of a degenerating research program. He tells the story of the logical positivist's verification principle, and how it had to be modified again and again, getting nowhere. Thus (p. 108):

That track record of failure is a more powerful argument against the very idea of the verification principle than the refutation of any specific version. If there were a workable version of the verification principle, the positivists would have found it . . . History keeps the track record of such efforts. It gives us evidence that an idea is no good because attempts to make it work lead to a degenerating research program.

If the failure of a few decades to find a version of the verification principle which could command consensus showed that it should be given up, how much more so the similar failure of a few millennia to find a consistent solution to the liar paradox?

Let me finish by returning to the book as a whole. As Williamson reminds us in its introduction, he has been doing philosophy now for something over 40 years. In that time, he has produced and defended many ideas that are novel, insightful, challenging. And he has done this with a clarity and verve that few philosophers can match. The present book, albeit brief and relatively informal, continues in the same mould.


Many thanks go to Williamson for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.