Doing Things for Reasons

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Rudiger Bittner, Doing Things for Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2001, 216pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-514364-7.

Reviewed by Robert Pippin, University of Chicago


When the infamous American bank robber, Willie Sutton, was asked why he robbed banks, he answered simply, “Because that’s where the money is.” This answer is funny, but its humor is ambiguous and could be explained in one of two ways. It could be funny because the response explains so little, is such a clear evasion of an answer, much in the manner of answering, “Why did Clinton win the election?” with “Because he got more votes.” But it could be funny because the answer is such a good and obvious explanation that the joke is directed more at the stupidity of the question than the oddness of the answer.

Is it a good explanation? In the standard philosophical literature on action, such “because…” answers, especially when the following phrase denotes simply a state of affairs or event, have not been prominent. Philosophers have tended to think that they don’t really explain enough. “In order to…” and “for the sake of…” forms are more familiar. This is because we tend to think that when the question concerns identifying the reasons for which actions are performed, we should be trying to identify what we desire to bring about and what we believe is an effective means to that end. Or we think the Sutton question must really be asking, “How is it that you came to desire an end (easy money, let’s say) so intensely?” “Why did you set that as your end?” or “Why do you believe that stealing money from banks is the most efficient way to obtain money?” or some such, and we tend therefore to regard answers like Sutton’s as necessarily elliptical, as really meaning, “I care so much about money that I am willing to take great personal risks to get some, and there’s a lot of this desired money in robbable banks.” Similar reformulations and ellipses would be necessary if we thought, not that mental states and events best explain (or perhaps even cause) actions, but that expected purposes do, that they “pull” agents toward them in some way, rather than “pushing” them along, that there is some not yet real but desirable end that could best serve as a reason in explanation of why the act occurred (even perhaps independently of what the agent actually desired or believed, but because of what was just true of him “by nature”); or if we thought that it was a belief about the perceived (if possibly incorrect) goodness of the course of action that best explained what the agent did, or if we thought that agents only acted on “maxims,” general principles of conduct, and that desires could be said to motivate action only if incorporated into such maxims.

Rüdiger Bittner argues in Doing Things for Reasons that we should, in effect, slow down in our rush to paraphrase and analyze and should notice the naturalness and persuasiveness of such “because…” explanations. If you ask John why he is pacing the floor (surely an action he performs and not like shivering in the cold), he will likely say, “Because I’m nervous.” It’s not very likely that he means, “I desire to relax, to ease my anxiety, and I believe that pacing will accomplish this.” He may have given no thought to relaxing; it’s the farthest thing from his mind; it’s not even a “calm passion.” And he may not at all believe that pacing relaxes him, may not believe that it is overall the best thing for him to do, may not at all be following the requirements of some general policy or maxim. What he means you to understand is that being nervous gives him a reason to pace. Similarly with moving a chess piece “because my castle is threatened”; stopping my car “because the police ordered me to”; and David was in high spirits, “so I stayed much longer”; and “Thank you; I do not eat meat,” given as a reason to a host who is about to plop something charred and smoking onto my plate.

Bittner argues that we should trust the appearances more. Such “because [some state of affairs or event]…” explanations do in fact identify reasons. He argues that the question: “what is a reason for which somebody does something, and how is the reason related to the action?” should be answered, “to do something for a reason is to do something that is a response to the state of affairs that is the reason.”(p. 161) If states of affairs (and events) can serve as reasons, and all we need for an explanation of acting on such reasons is a certain discriminatory consciousness of such states, coupled with a history of the agent (or creature) that, by virtue of such a narrative, can make clear the relevance of that state for that creature, then, Bittner cheerfully admits, there is not much left of the “rational agency” ideal so important to the philosophical tradition from Plato to Kant and beyond. Ducks clearly have reasons in this sense. So do computers, depending on how one interprets “cognizance” of a state. Indeed, as far as I can see, Coke machines can be said to have a reason to dispense a Coke to you, having “detected” in their own humble way an event (your inserting a coin), which, given the “history” of the machine (its design and construction), “calls for” a response on the machine’s part. (Bittner’s standards on cognition don’t seem very high. See p. 72 on what must be “registered.” Or p. 164: “Rational agents are animals sniffing their way through the world. They are not in control. They are given to what they encounter.” So I’m not sure whether he would regard this as a counter-example to his thesis or as confirmation of the humble status of rational agency.)

But we are getting ahead of ourselves. Bittner needs first to justify his claims about the insufficiency of the belief-desire, Kantian, teleological or other models of action, and then to clarify the three main components of his account: states of affairs and events as “reasons,” what “responsiveness” amounts to, and how the appeal to “history” works. The first three chapters tackle the critical task, the next four set out his theory, and the next four deal with whether his theory can account for the many things we would like to say about a person’s reasons and with potential criticisms from “internalists” and “normativists” about reasons. His final chapter spells out the bad news about rational agency and human dignity.

The attack on the belief/desire model is a good example of the brusque, impatient, often refreshing and amusing, sometimes dismissive style of the book, as if someone takes himself to be telling us for the first time that the emperor has no clothes. The approach seems not to rest on anything like giving the necessary and sufficient conditions for the correct use of the language of accountability or action-explanation or the like, and certainly rejects anything like a transcendental argument about the necessary conditions of the intelligibility of actions or action statements. The argument rests on something more informal. Why should doing something “in response” to a state or event count as “doing it for a reason”? “The answer is that this makes the best sense of how we ordinarily think and speak of reasons for which people do things.” (p. 74) Therewith, questions such as the following are posed. Has anyone ever really provided an argument to show that appeal to desires and beliefs are required in any explanation of action (such that desire sets the end sought or motivates, and belief “steers,” governs the direction of action)? Not Davidson, not Michael Smith (although he is given credit for trying), and so on. Hasn’t this become just another dogma in some camps? And in fact, we often have desires for things, which desires don’t motivate us at all (we wouldn’t think of acting on them), so it can’t be just the having of desires that explains anything. And beliefs don’t steer anything. Their objects are just facts. We may be said to steer our actions and make use of beliefs in doing so, but that is what we were to explain in the first place. And when we enter a store to buy a watch we see in the window, can it really be said that we are motivated by a “desire to buy the watch,” as if what we are trying to do is put an end to this uncomfortable desire, or uncomfortable “itch,” to satisfy an uncomfortable lack? (Cf. on this point the useful, if odd, comparison of piano playing and masturbation, p. 156; and p. 75 on the availability of Jersey cows in Hereford as a reason, all by itself.) Doesn’t the availability of the affordable watch explain our action just fine? (Given that we can establish a suitable relevance for such a state. More on that below.) And, in a familiar sort of example in this debate, isn’t it possible that someone could have found that the circumstances in his life leave room for only one appropriate response, suicide, even though we would say that he “desired” to put an end to his life only if we were already dogmatically committed to a theory that said we had to find such a desire? (Don’t people often do things for which they have no “pro-attitudes”?) All of which leads to: “…it seems fair to conclude that the picture of agency underlying the desire/belief thesis is incoherent.” (22)

It is Bittner’s view that we have been confused about most of this since Plato, his model of the divided soul, and the location of the engine of action in desire. Bittner recognizes that in the Socratic picture, the main determinant in action is an opinion about the good, so much so that akrasia is denied (no one would ever do what he believed bad for himself; his doing it is proof he held it to be better; vice is merely ignorance, etc.) but Bittner thinks that this position requires that “reason has desires of its own,” which he calls “incomprehensible.” (36) (Or, the Socratic position would have it that doing things for reasons presupposes an attempt to do things for good reasons, which Bittner also rejects (87).

This is all a bit hasty, it seems to me. The issue in Socrates, or Aristotle and McDowell for that matter, is not a reliance on a claim about metaphysically established truth directing our action all at once, “automatically,” but could be seen as quite compatible with Bittner’s own realist position, once we know more about what a direct “responsiveness” to the world amounts to (how seeing something gives us a reason), and how our histories dispose us to be responsive in this way rather than that, at least if that history can include some education about what experience might teach us is good for us, or at least in some way preferable.

Throughout these historical chapters, Bittner raises genuine, thorny problems, especially about Kant, especially with respect to current popular interpretations of Kant on maxims (how to tell, if ever, which is my maxim), and the problem of judgment (if discriminatory finesse is needed to save Kant from the rigorism and formalism objections, what does this do to the moral egalitarianism at the heart of Kant?).

But the heart of the position is simply: “A reason for which something is done is something to which the action is a response.” (p. 95) All the philosophical weight in such a claim comes down on what “response” amounts to, and raises the questions of what sorts of states/events are those which “call for a response” and how one might distinguish between genuine or appropriate responses, as matters of fact. (I might believe that my student’s answer in class calls for the response of howling like a wolf, but—one would like to be able to say—I would be wrong, no matter what my history or the state of the world.) We also must be able to distinguish between events that merely regularly occasion a reaction from those that prompt a real response. (I might regularly stop work and have a beer when the bells in the college chapel ring at five o’clock, and in some sense I could be said to be reacting to that event, but I would not have explained my beer drinking by citing the bells ringing.) This in turn, then, shifts a good deal of the argumentative weight onto Bittner’s appeal to history, and whether he can say enough about that appeal to do more than point to such historical narration as a necessary condition for making out such relevant states/events, whether he can say enough to show how it can be sufficient to do what his account requires.

There is not, however, a well worked out theory of such a narration. (Bittner does not think his account, focused narrowly on the topic of reasons, needs to get into this topic, but until we know more about “response” and successful historical narration, his position remains incomplete.) I think it is right and important to say that we will not be able to understand what counted for an agent as a reason without some historical narrative, but whether that can stop at a “life history” or whether it requires a somewhat more ambitious history (given that no one’s life history explains very much of his dispositions and cares all by itself) is an important, though here neglected, question. (There might be some historical, social situation where an adequate response to a demand for a justifying reason could be, “Because I am a citizen,” or “Because I am banker,” but we’ll need to know a lot about such a society to be able to understand that response. This would lead us to Hegel’s account in a way somewhat different from that cited by Bittner at the end of his account.) Sometimes explanation just by “reference to an antecedent state” qualifies for Bittner (p.82), sometimes he gestures at the need for a “pattern” of explaining actions by such reasons (p. 92) but more often the issue is continually cloaked in metaphors (something in itself odd, given Bittner’s general impatience with allusive philosophizing). Identifying what is responsive requires our “marking out paths among states and events, in particular actions.” (67) Reasons (states/events) exert a kind of “force” on us (if we are “attentive” enough) (p. 129). Reasons are like “letters the world has written to you…” (p.125) Such reasons are like “proposals, offers, or invitations the world extends to you.” (p. 142) The world “offers you numerous threads to keep knitting on,” (p. 147) such that various aspects of that world come to “matter,” or not, to be salient or not. Given your life history, your taking some aspects of the world to “call for” something or to be “inviting” you to act could also be all mistaken; that course would not really “fit” you. (p. 148) I can, by giving you advice or trying to persuade you, alter the “landscape of reasons for action.” (p.169)

But these metaphors don’t tell us much about what is involved in a state “calling for a response” and just what a genuine response involves. These sound like normative notions, and so this gap is especially problematic because Bittner takes a strong position on the issue on the normativity of reasons. He claims that, “there is nothing normative about reasons one has.” (p. 135) This means that someone who does not do what he has reasons to do has not failed in any normative way; nothing is “amiss.” But Bittner’s own language appeals to “failing to deliver something that is due” (p. 141, my emphasis). And it seems odd, in Bittner’s sense of ordinary language, to say that an irrational agent is “just one of those people who doesn’t do what he has reason to do.” We would not say, of someone playing chess who moves his pawn four spaces diagonally to thwart a threat, that he hasn’t “failed” in any way or that he just is not one of those people who does not do what he has reason to do. We would say he is not abiding by the rules he accepted when he agreed to play; he is not doing what he ought to do; his failure to be properly responsive to what he has reason to do is a normative failure.

Bittner realizes of course that identifying any such reason will be “agent relative,” and so realizes that we also need an account of aspects of the agent’s orientation, disposition, and so forth, all again filled out with a historical story, in order to answer the “what counts as (genuinely) responsive to the world” question. Agents are, after all, “differentially sensitive action–producers” (p. 107) and the world itself is not a set of possible reasons, waiting to latch on to an agent passing by. Admitting this is an interesting qualification on the “realism” of the theory (although Bittner struggles to avoid such an inference, as in his disagreements with Darwall, pp. 108ff. Bittner also bites the realist bullet here, and claims that if Henry, say, took shelter because of a coming thunderstorm and it turns out that there was no such storm, then he did what he did, strictly speaking, for no reason. Rather implausibly, I think, Bittner claims that Henry’s asking for shelter in this no-storm case should be understood as a “truncated version of asking for shelter with a thunderstorm coming.” (p. 115) One might want to be cautious about wholesale commitments to a psychological or subjectivist theory of practical reasons, but this seems to me too cautious. As Bittner’s own position shows, we can’t determine what counts as a reason without some attention to what is going on “inside” the agent. In some cases we will need to be able to say that Henry’s beliefs and his desire-based “sensitivity” to possible rain best explain what he did, what he thought gave him reason to act.) And the issue itself opens up a number of important questions.

For one thing, as just noted, desires must re-enter the picture, though not now as reasons for which actions are undertaken, but as something like conditions of relevance. (“…this does not mean that the qualities to which it is due that people have the reasons they do are themselves their reasons.” (p. 124) This is inconsistent though with Bittner’s own sweeping rejection of “internalism” in Chapter Nine. If arguments like Bernard Williams’ relativize a possible reason to something like a “motivational set” (which need not comprise only present desires or rationally accessible desires, but concerns and cares and commitments of all sorts), then Bittner himself admits the same thing by relativizing what can count as reasons to…what? The agent’s set of cares, concerns, dispositions and interests? That sounds like internalism to me, and a good thing too. (The point is a contrast to a robust “externalism,” the claim that agents have reasons to obey God or seek the good or whatever, regardless of whether they could ever be said to actually adopt any such reason, whether, to use Bittner’s language, those matters could ever be shown to be relevant to a possible response. One need not be committed to a theory of psychological causation or anything similar to reject that claim. Bittner’s relativization will do, and we can then get busy trying to understand what features of the subject are required for features of the objective world to count as reasons. The real problem with internalism is that when it is rightly spelled out, it is unclear who, apart from theological absolutists and G.E. Moore, ever really believed in any form of its contrary, externalism.)

That is, one of the best aspects of Bittner’s realism is that he concedes that there can be no Platonic-like account of what events in the world just do count as reasons for action, full stop, in complete, utter independence of the “subjective” side, without needing to be relativized to a subject’s “concerns,” let us say. I think this is quite right, and it introduces exactly the concern with history that Bittner approaches. But it also seems to me to call for a more ambitious theory (about the “subjective dynamics” side, let us say) and a more ambitious historical story – if we really want to explain what state/event counted for a subject as a reason for a subject and why – and to require reference to issues of meaning and meaning holism that Bittner rejects in Chapter Six. (That is, we need to understand how we account for the rather thick descriptions of the world necessary to get all of this going in the first place. What I am responding to is not the movement of a wooden piece but your threatening move. At some point we are going to need a social and not just a personal history. Bittner obscures this somewhat by shifting attention immediately to whether we can provide constitutive or a priori rules for the possibility of any such practices.)

Bittner takes up quite a few other topics in the closing chapters: can his account explain advice-giving, deliberation, the supposed normativity of reasons (it cannot because there is no such thing), the weight or preponderance of one reason over another, the purposiveness of action, and “doing things for fun.” As is usual in a context like this, I have tried mostly to summarize the book, and raise questions about what seem to me gaps in the argument. This leaves little space left over for listing the book’s many virtues, a boring exercise in any case. But there are many virtues, and I do want to stress that anyone interested in these topics will learn a great deal from this intelligent, crisply written book and – and even rarer treat – will probably enjoy themselves too.