Doing Without Concepts

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Edouard Machery, Doing Without Concepts, Oxford UP, 2009, 283pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195306880.

Reviewed by Georges Rey, University of Maryland



For many of us, philosophy of mind and language in the last fifty years has benefitted greatly from em­pir­ical work in psychology and linguistics, and Edouard Machery presumably has such benefits in mind in offering a clear, well-written and up-to-date discussion of the now extensive empirical work on “con­cepts”. In this brief review for philosophers, I’ll focus primarily on the relevance this book has for them, though my remarks rebound to the psychology.

I put “concepts” in scare quotes because, partly in view of Machery’s own claims and partly in view of some qualms I’ll raise, it’s not entirely clear just what he takes himself to be discussing. Certainly, much of the psychological work he reviews explicitly addresses the nature of “concepts”. How­ever, the bulk of his discussion (chapters 3-7) is supposed to show that this work, the processes it studies, and the theories that emerge from it are so diverse that it would best if we just dropped the appearance of a uni­fied topic (chapter 8). Con­cepts aren’t a natural kind, and we’d be better off not thinking in terms of them.

The work Machery reviews consists of abundant experiments from the last forty years on various topics, including: the procedures people seem to employ in such processes as categorization and concept learning (saying whether, e.g., a penguin is a bird, or learning what counts as “postmodern architecture”, chapter 6); deductive and inductive inference (saying whether, e.g., an ostrich has a certain property given that a sparrow does, §7.1); and conceptual combination (understanding what a grandmother spy might be, §7.2). Results in these areas have led many psychologists to reject what they regard as “the Classical View” that was inherited from traditional philosophy, according to which concepts have necessary and sufficient defining conditions known to competent users of them (p.169). Psycho­logists argue that what people seem to be using instead in the above tasks are “prototypes” (representa­tions of clusters of properties that good examples of a category tend to share, §4.2), “exemplars” (repre­sen­tations of remem­bered instances, §4.3), sometimes “ideal examples” and “perceptual representations” (§4.6), some­times folk and scientific theories (§4.4) — and only occasionally classical definitions (p.169). Mach­ery thinks this diversity is best explained by his “Hetero­geneity Hypothesis” (chapter 3), according to which

an individual typically has several concepts, … several bodies of knowledge that are by default retrieved from long-term memory and used when he or she categorizes, reasons inductively or deductively, or makes analogies. (p.52)

He does think that “prototypes, exemplars, and theories are among the ‘fundamental’ kinds of concepts,” in that they subsume strategies across domains, but argues that “there is no evidence that the notion of concept underwrites non-trivial scientific generalizations,” and that therefore the term “ought to be eliminated from psychology” (pp.245-6).

As rich and detailed as Machery’s discussion is, it seems to me to fall far short of supporting any such “drastic” conclusion (p.251). On the face of it, concepts are the stuff of which psychological claims and explanations are made. Generalizations and explanations of, e.g., cognitive development, fallacies in reasoning, vision and language understanding (to take some of the more successful areas of recent psychology) — all these presuppose concepts as shared constituents of the propositional attitudes the explanations concern.1 It’s not clear how even to describe the phenomenon of the Müller-Lyer illusion unless we can presume that people share a concept of longer than, or the gambler’s fallacy, without them sharing more likely. Concepts seem to be natural kinds at least to the extent that they are the kinds of entity over which psychology generalizes.

Now, to be sure, it’s hard to say what a concept is that can serve this purpose. This is a piece of the hard problem of “intentionality” that Brentano brought to modern attention, a problem that, as these things go, has standardly fallen to philosophy to discuss. A solution to it should, of course, be informed by empirical data. However, it needn’t be sacrificed to it, and although Machery is a philosopher, his treatment of philosophical work on the issue is oddly perfunc­tory. In the chapter “Concepts in Philo­sophy”, he acknow­ledges this “foundational” task for philosophy, but doesn’t seem to take it very seriously. Stunningly, the only work he discusses in any detail is that of Chris­topher Pea­­­cocke.2 Now, although Pea­cocke is indeed an impor­tant voice — and many of Machery’s criticisms of him are quite cogent — he is also in some respects an un­typ­i­cal one. His work harkens back to a traditional “analytic” approach that ties con­cepts to facts about what someone would be disposed to infer (or find “primi­tively compell­ing”), i.e., a ver­sion of the “Classical View” that many psychologists have rejected (pp.80-3).

A significant number of recent philosophers, however, have rejected it as well, offering interesting proposals in its place. Most conspicuously, there are various forms of “external­ist” views that have been proposed by, e.g., Kripke, Putnam, Burge (1986), Dretske, Millikan, Devitt (1996) and — most importantly for his own substantial knowledge and work in psychology — Jerry Fodor (1990, 1998). According to these views, the identity conditions for a concept are (to a first approximation) provided not by some condition internal to a thinker, but by relations the thinker bears to phenomena in the external world. Some combine externalism with an internal condition, as in the “two factor” proposals of Loar, Block, Prinz and, actually, Pea­cocke, in his full view. At most, Machery considers some of the “intui­tions” that motivate external­ism — only to dismiss them as too cross-culturally variable and unreliable to support any serious theory, given the results of recent “experimental philosophy” (pp.48-50, 226-30). Leave aside whether these latter results do justice to the full range of the relevant “intui­tions”.3 The issue here is whether in neglecting externalism, Machery has neglect­ed serious proposals that usefully address the foundational issues for psychology, and so might connect the philosophical and psychological concerns.4

Machery correctly notes that one objection to Peacocke’s inferential account is that it fails suf­fi­ciently to address Quine’s attack on the analytic/synthetic distinction (p.39). He doesn’t, however, go on to dis­cuss the implications of Quine’s attack: how it equally threatens any purely epistemic proposal, includ­ing Machery’s own, and how it undermines the possi­bility of any determinate mentalistic psycho­logy. This is puzzling, given Fodor’s exten­sive discussion of many of these issues in at least five of his recent books, a discussion quite often directed explicitly at the psychological theories Machery con­siders.

Consider Machery’s own characterization of what psychologists take concepts to be:

©: A concept of x is a body of knowledge about x that is stored in long-term memory and that is used by default in the processes underlying most, if not all, higher cognitive competencies when these processes result in judgments about x. (p.12)

As Fodor, following Quine, would emphasize, the “bodies of knowledge” people use in making judgments about a topic varies with their knowledge.5 Unless one restricts the relevant knowledge in some principled way (which Fodor and Quine argue no one has done), no two people will share a concept, since, short of coincid­ence, no two people will bring exactly the same knowledge or procedures to bear in making many of their judgments, and a single person may use different knowledge and procedures for different tasks.6 Call this the problem of epistemic variability. I venture to say that it is this variability that Machery is noticing in his emphasis upon heterogeneity. Why isn’t the moral here merely that, in fixing their beliefs, people make use of whatever they think works, and what works varies? Rather than inviting us to abandon the notion of concept, perhaps this variability is simply a reason to abandon an epistemic conception of it.

Machery would probably reply that I’m merely pressing here the philosophical notion of concept, which is concerned with the individuation of propositional attitudes (pp.32-3), a topic that he — rather surprisingly — claims is not the concern of psychological theory (p.34). Indeed, when the two tasks are properly distinguished, “most philosophical attacks against the psychological theories of concepts are decisively undermined” (p.51).

“Decisively”? There are a number of important reasons to think not.

In the first place, as Machery himself notes, many psychologists them­selves are hardly clear about the difference between the two concerns, often presenting their work as refuting the Classical View of traditional philosophy and supporting some philosophical alternative (pp.35-7). Indeed, Rosch’s pioneering work on prototypes was explicitly inspired by Wittgenstein’s “family resemblance” suggestions about concepts — and, one should add, by the epistemic (e.g., verificationist) conceptions that were implicit in his and many other suggestions of the time, and are influential to the present day (pp.83-5). (Fodor argues that this is where not only the whole of cognitive science, but the entire twentieth century went wrong [Fodor 1998, 2004].)

Secondly, concept identification would seem to be an issue not about how people do think on this or that occasion under pressure of time, but how they could think if they were to reflect — what they could under­stand. Pace Machery, this seems as apt a topic as any for psychological research (p.34). It may well be that many people’s proto­type of a doctor is of a man in a white coat; nevertheless if they really couldn’t conceive of a young woman doctor in a dark one, any more than they could of a round square, that would be a reason to think they hadn’t really grasped the con­cept doctor. It’s because people likely do have a concept that transcends their stereo­types and common “know­ledge” that it’s worth reasoning with them, i.e., modifying their epistemic position by citing evidence or argument.7 Concepts are what remain stable across epistemic variability, and so give argu­ment a point. This stability is surely of interest both to philosophy and psychology, framing the questions of what people could learn, and what might be the limits of reason and thought.

Thirdly, if psychologists themselves are to make sense of their results, they obviously need to pre­sup­pose some notion of conceptual stability, since, otherwise, they would have no reason to suppose that different people using the same word mean the same thing. If you’re faster at identifying three-legged dogs that I am because your proto­typical dog is three-legged, why isn’t that a reason for thinking that your use of “dog” means something dif­fer­ent from mine (p.174)? Why -misleadingly? - label the “several concepts ‘dog1,’ ‘dog2,’ …” up to ‘dog5 billion’ and climbing (p.60)? What makes them all dog concepts? Without some kind of serious answer to this question and an account of conceptual stability, it’s, again, hard to see how psychologists could sustain their explanations.8

Lastly, as Machery notes, there is a need of a “coherent frame­work” for bringing together the psychologists’ different proposals (p.247). Something like the externalist strategies may be just the sort of thing for the purpose. The externalist at least addresses the problem of epistemic variability in a promising way, pro­posing that concepts are constituted by some external causal/historical, selec­tional, or counterfactual rela­tion — or, more abstractly, as Devitt and Horwich have suggested, in the use of a symbol that is “explanatorily basic” (Devitt 1996, Horwich 1998).9 A crucial feature of this strategy is that it makes no commitment to the char­acter of the represen­ta­tions people use in ordin­ary circumstances requiring rapid reasoning — or even in “acquir­ing” the concept. Indeed, it allows for the possibility — famously endorsed by Fodor and Chomsky, echoing Plato and Descartes — that many concepts may be innate: a significant set of the primi­tives of our thought may have their contents fixed by relations they bear to external phenom­ena, even though these relations may not be immediately evident in either acquisition or ordinary use.

Machery worries about how the philosophical and psychological interests in concepts could be connected (pp.47-51). Externalism offers a straightforward suggestion: the psychological research on proto­types, theories, exemplars, etc. simply concerns the various cognitive means people use to deploy con­cepts whose content and identity is determined externally. In this way, Machery is quite right to claim that the psychological and philosophical work differ in at least their local concerns. If these different concerns can be coherently related as means and ends, however, why shouldn’t that be a reason to hang on to the notion of concept, and just find words to mark the difference? Some have sug­gested, e.g., ­"conception" in addition to “concept.” Mach­ery’s eliminativist conclusion about “concepts” would then amount simply to the unsur­pris­ing observation that there is no interesting theory of all the concep­tions people have of things, i.e., no sub­stan­­tive general theory of all the “bodies of knowledge” they use in their thought. This doesn’t entail that concepts aren’t the very natural kinds that determine what these different conceptions are about, viz., the kinds that figure in standard psychological explanations. There’s probably no gen­eral theory about all the ways to skin a cat either, but that doesn’t mean we can do without the concept cat.

Nothing of what I’ve said here is meant to suggest that any externalist (or other) proposals are yet satis­factory (see Segal 2000 and Rey 2009 for serious qualms). Even their most ardent proponents would agree that at best they suggest a strategy for allowing for conceptual stability across people. It’s not that Machery should have endorsed externalist strategies; my point is simply that he should have discussed them, particularly before giving up on the concept of concept entirely.


Burge, T. (1986), “Individualism and Psychology,” Philosophical Review, XCV, (1):3-46

Devitt, M. (forthcoming), “Experimental Semantics,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research

Devitt, M. (1996), Coming to Our Senses, Cambridge University Press

Fodor, J. (1990), A Theory of Content and Other Essays, Cambridge; MIT Press

Fodor, J. (1998), Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong, Cambridge: MIT Press

Fodor, J. (2004), “Having Concepts: A Brief Refutation of the 20th Century”, Mind and Language 19(1)

Horwich, P. (1998), Meaning, Oxford University Press.

Rey, G. (1985), “Concepts and Conceptions: a Reply to Smith, Medin and Rips,” Cognition 19:297-303

Rey, G. (2009), “Concepts, Defaults, and Internal Asymmetric Dependencies: Distillations of Fodor and Horwich” in The A Priori and Its Role in Philosophy, ed. N. Kompa, C. Nimtz, and C. Suhm; Paderborn: Mentis

Segal, G. (2000), A Thin Book About Narrow Content, Cambridge: MIT Press

1 Machery considers some generalizations (pp.244-5), but they are only meta-conceptual ones explicitly about concepts, not the more usual ones in which concepts are simply used in attribution.

2 It’s also striking that philosophy nowhere is mentioned in the summary, concluding chapter.

3 See Devitt (forthcoming) for reasons to think not­. Note that Machery fails to notice that, for example, Burge’s arguments for externalism do not rest on ordinary attitude ascriptions alone, but on explanatory features of a Marrian theory of vision (Burge 1986). Moreover, the significance of externalist proposals is not that thinkers’ deployment of concepts is always externally grounded, but only that this happens a lot and is surely a serious possibility. That’s all that’s needed to refute the traditional, purely internalist view.

4 Perhaps Machery thinks this work con­cerns reference not concepts — he frequently talks of the differences between “co-referential” concepts, as though reference were a separate matter — and perhaps some of it does. Nevertheless much of it is neither presented nor understood in this way, especially by, say, Burge, Fodor or Devitt. Indeed, it’s tendentious how — or even whether — to distinguish among reference, sense, meaning, content, and con­cepts, not to mention settling on which of them provide the proper objects of thought.

5 Or, rather, beliefs. Machery uses “knowledge” as psychologists do, without commitment to truth or justification (p.8).

6 Of course, there may be similarities and substantial overlap in many people’s knowledge and procedures (at least relative to the stability of their other concepts), precisely as the psychological evidence attests. Mere similarity and overlap, however, are not identity, and it is identity in concepts that is needed to sustain serious explanations, such as ones about cognitive development, vision or language. How are you to include both of us in generalizations about the Müller-Lyer, if your understanding of “longer than” includes Special Relativity and mine doesn’t, or your prototype is of fingers and mine of lengths of string? Further, what are we to say about the vast numbers of cases in which people rely not on any of the procedures Machery reviews, but just on the testimony of others, as when they categorize Polk as a president or learn that Bill’s friend Tom is a bachelor?

7 Not to beat my own drum, but this was the main point of my (1986), which Machery references but never dis­cusses.

8 Still another problem that Machery strangely doesn’t address is Fodor’s main argument against epistemic notions of concept, viz., the difficulty of conceptual combination (Fodor 1998). Machery does discuss the issue (§7.2), but only relatively unproblematic instances of it, such as grandmother spy, not the notoriously harder cases of, e.g., pet fish, or not a fish, for which it’s harder to get the epistemics to compose. (For example, the prototype of pet fish does not seem to be a function of the prototypes of pet and fish individually, and there isn’t a prototypical non-fish.)

9 Horwich’s neat idea of the meaning constitutive conditions being the ones on which all other uses of a symbol explanatorily depend can be seen as an internalist variant of Fodor’s “asymmetric dependency” that achieves some of its same effects, but without its strong externalist commitments (Horwich 1998:41, Fodor 1992). See my (2009) for discussion.