Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality

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Ernest Lepore and Kirk Ludwig, Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality, Oxford University Press, 2005, 464pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199251347.

Reviewed by James W. Garson, University of Houston


Over the last forty years, Donald Davidson has been one of the most influential, but least accessible voices in philosophy. There are several reasons why it is hard to come to grips with his work. First, his language is dense, even by the standards of analytic philosophy; while at the same time his thought is highly organic, so that it is difficult to make sense of one idea without an understanding of his whole program. Davidson never attempted to write a book that would provide an easy entry into the interconnections between his many influential and controversial views. Nor did he attempt to record the evolution of his thought, keeping track of how reconsiderations on one point would affect the tenability of the others. It is perhaps a good thing too, for as the volume to be reviewed here makes clear, such a massive project would have left him with little time for his later contributions to philosophy.

In Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality, Ernie Lepore and Kirk Ludwig have done the philosophical community a great service by beginning the project of providing an accessible account of Davidson's work, along with an informed and sympathetic critical analysis. Davidson's earliest papers fell into two seemingly unrelated categories: (1) his articles on action theory and the philosophy of mind, which were launched by "Actions, Reasons, and Causes" (1963), and (2) his work in the philosophy of language on meaning and theories of truth, which descended from "Truth and Meaning" (1967). While they show how Davidson's views on human agency interlock with his views on meaning, Lepore and Ludwig make no attempt to cover Davidson's work on action theory here. Furthermore, they leave the more technical issues concerning the core of Davidson's theory of meaning to another book: Donald Davidson: Truth Theoretic Semantics (Oxford University Press, 2005). Even so, the volume to be reviewed here is a workout. It runs to well over 400 pages of compactly written presentation and analysis.

The book is divided into three parts. The first, entitled "A Historical Introduction to Truth-Value Semantics", covers Davison's proposal that by forging a Tarski-style extensional theory of truth for a language that would satisfy the famous Convention T, one would have all that is required for, or that could be expected from, a theory of meaning for that language. The second, entitled "Radical Interpretation", discusses Davidson's project of showing how an empirical theory of truth for a human language might be constructed by an investigator (the radical interpreter) who relies on evidence about speakersÕ behavior (including which sentences they assent to) that does not presuppose any prior knowledge of what the speakers mean. The third part, entitled "Metaphysics and Epistemology" discusses Davidson's views on a number of topics that are related to what went before, including his attack on the notion of alternative conceptual schemes, his rejection of radical skepticism, his claim that thought requires language, his acceptance of the inscrutability of reference, and several more.

One of the main concerns of part 1 of this book is to try to resolve a contentious issue in Davidson interpretation. Did he think that the concept of meaning is so flawed that no theory of it would be philosophically viable, so that the theory of truth for a language counts as a replacement for a theory of meaning, or was his project instead to show how a compositional account of meaning can be constructed on the extensional framework of a theory of truth? Lepore and Ludwig argue forcefully for the second way of understanding Davidson's program.

A central question they raise here is whether Davidson takes the theory of truth to be interpretive. A non-interpretive theory attempts only to provide the recursive rules explaining how truth for complex expressions depends on values of their parts, while an interpretive theory also assigns semantical values to the primitive expressions (presumably, the terms and predicates) of the language, so that the truth-values of all sentences are thereby determined. Given an interpretive theory of the truth predicate ('is true') for a language, there is reason to hope that one may satisfy Tarski's Convention T, namely that the theory be able to prove all sentences of the form [T],

[T] s is true iff p,

where s is any sentence of the language, and 'p' is replaced by a sentence that translates s. If it does, the replacement for 'p' in [T] gives an account of the meaning of s for each sentence of the language.

Davidson's seminal articles clearly state the restriction that the truth theory should appeal to no semantical notions beyond the truth predicate being defined. This would appear to entail that the truth theory be non-interpretive, on the grounds that fixing semantical values of the primitives violates that restriction. But if it is non-interpretive, the theory is unable to fix values of any of the sentences, and so there is no hope of satisfying Convention T. The weakness of non-interpretive theories is reason for thinking that Davidson must have abandoned the project of providing a robust account of meaning, and concluding that the theory of truth serves as a replacement for a theory of meaning.

Lepore and Ludwig argue that there is no way to make sense of his program unless the truth theory is interpretive. Furthermore, they explain why Davidson would have thought that his restriction on the truth theory was compatible with its being interpretive after all. When adjustments are made to the project to handle context-sensitive expressions such as demonstratives, Davidson had every reason to hope that the theory of truth would automatically fix the correct semantical values for the primitives of the language. So at least one reason for thinking that Davison intended to eliminate meaning rather than reconstruct it is disposed of.

Davidson came to realize that his hopes that an extensional theory of truth so construed would by itself generate an adequate account of meaning were misguided, for reasons well canvassed in this book, some of which are familiar. It was at this point that he turned to the line of research outlined in "Radical Interpretation", namely to show how an investigator could, at least in principle, come to understand a language given speaker behavior but no antecedent information about meaning. In part 2 of this book, Lepore and Ludwig characterize radical interpretation as providing a new constraint on the theory of truth - one Davidson hoped would help more adequately fix meaning. The theory would have to receive empirical support from all evidence accessible to a radical interpreter.

The authors argue that this empirical constraint by itself fails to yield a theory of truth that properly undergirds an account of meaning. The correct constraint, they contend, is simply that the theory be interpretive, and this is compatible with, and in fact essential to, Davidson's project. So why did Davidson launch an inquiry which turns out to be irrelevant? Perhaps they say, because having failed at the ambitious project of showing that a truth theory automatically fixes the semantical values of the primitives, he failed to realize that he could instead simply stipulate that the truth theory be interpretive, providing a less ambitious but nonetheless adequate version of his program.

The authors go on to discuss a number of issues surrounding radical interpretation. They formulate three different ways of understanding the constraint that the interpreter use the Principle of Charity, and argue that another, stronger principle (called Grace) is needed for success. They then discuss the failure of several arguments that attempt to justify Grace. The principle would follow if one were to have an a priori assurance that radical interpretation is possible. For this and other reasons, the authors contend that Davidson needs such a demonstration. However, the possibility of radical interpretation is compromised, they claim, by the fact that evidence available to a radical interpreter significantly underdetermines meaning.

One might wonder why this is a problem, since Davidson is famous for championing the indeterminacy of meaning. Isn't the underdetermination of theories of meaning by the evidence a natural consequence of the indeterminacy of meaning that Davidson claims we must accept in any case? The authors' answer is a resounding "No", for among other things, the underdetermination at issue involves theories equally well supported by the evidence that are essentially incompatible with one another, incompatible because being alternatives stated in the same metalanguage, the metalanguage must be committed to distinguishing between the differences in meanings the alternative theories assign. Lepore and Ludwig go on to consider whether further constraints on the truth theory might solve the problem. Here they discuss Davidson's work on how a decision theory for human action might sufficiently tighten up the account of meaning. But to no avail, since the considerations against the possibility of radical translation remain.

Part 3 of this book includes a discussion of how appeals to the process of radical interpretation help generate Davidson's controversial positions in metaphysics and epistemology. The demand that the interpreter employ the Principle of Charity provides one way of arguing for the conclusion that massive error in one's beliefs is impossible, and so radical skepticism is false. Similar considerations appear to support the view that genuinely distinct conceptual schemes are impossible. The authors conclude, however, that neither line of reasoning is convincing.

Part 3 also contains discussions of Davidson's later doctrines on mental content including his brand of externalism, his claim that thought requires language, and the inscrutability of reference. The idea that communication in a social setting is a precondition for making sense of the mental is another important theme here. The authors discuss the theses that communication is essential for knowledge, that triangulation (locating causes of common responses in two or more parties) must be used to help fix mental content, and that a third-person rather than first-person characterization of mental states is primary. On the last point, Davidson is taken to task for failing to provide an adequate explanation of our first-person authority concerning our own mental states, and for failure to rebut arguments concluding that first-person awareness must play at least some role in an analysis of the mental.

A review cannot do justice to the rich, intricate, and valuable analysis presented in this book. One of its main strengths is the introduction of nicely crafted distinctions used in clear and helpful reconstructions of Davidson's arguments. It is easy to find one's way around in this work, as there are clear guideposts to what will be covered in each chapter, and excellent summaries at the end of both chapters and sections. There are not many typos, but there is a problem with [1] on p. 73 which is, strictly speaking, incoherent because 's' does not appear free on the right hand side of the iff. However, examination of [T] on p. 71 and a little thought makes clear what was intended. Though complex and subtle, this book will be accessible to undergraduate philosophy majors with a taste for hard work. Despite relatively little discussion of the secondary literature, this is also a must read for any Davidson scholar.

Readers should be warned that one is likely to finish this book feeling depressed about Davidson's achievement. While the critical analysis is both respectful and sympathetic, serious problems with all of Davidson's main lines of reasoning are on display. Several of these mistakes are especially damning, since they are described as the result of Davidson's misapprehensions about the shape of his own project. The authors do remind us that philosophy is difficult business, and few philosophers could be expected to present flawless cases on issues with the heft of those that Davidson tackles. Furthermore, the complexity, cleverness, creativity, and intellectual stamina of Davidson's work shines out in this book, despite the negative appraisal. But at least on some occasions, one might have characterized the situation more charitably by viewing Davidson's corpus as an invitation to enter into a network of beliefs with strongly interlocking connections and interesting philosophical consequences. In passing, Lepore and Ludwig mention the possibility of evaluating Davidson in this way. However, after 400 pages of relentless rough sledding, one could use more help in making sense of Davidson's reputation as a great philosopher.