Donald Davidson on Truth, Meaning, and the Mental

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Gerhard Preyer (ed.), Donald Davidson on Truth, Meaning, and the Mental, Oxford University Press, 2012, 288pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199697519.

Reviewed by José Luis Bermúdez, Texas A&M University


This is an unusual book. Its title suggests that it is a collection of essays about Donald Davidson's views on truth, meaning, and the mental. But the focus is really much more on Davidson as refracted through the lens of Ernie Lepore and Kirk Ludwig's two volumes, Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality (OUP 2005) and Davidson: Truth-theoretic Semantics (OUP 2007)). The Lepore/Ludwig interpretation is, by my count, the direct focus of seven of the twelve papers. Moreover, the editor does not contribute an introduction to the volume, leaving the task instead to Lepore and Ludwig. The overall result is the sense of participating in an ongoing debate whose parameters are never made clear and that is taking place in something of a vacuum. We are told in the brief Preface that Lepore and Ludwig have provided "a new systematization of his philosophy of language, meaning, and thought" (vii), and Lepore and Ludwig themselves provide an overview of Davidson's work, but at no point is it explained just what Lepore and Ludwig are proposing, how it differs from standard interpretations of Davidson, and, most importantly, why getting Davidson right should matter to us.

This last question is particularly important. In the Preface, Preyer claims that "Davidson has been a considerable presence in the philosophical landscape since the 1970s" (vii). I have my doubts about whether Davidson persists as a significant figure in the contemporary philosophical landscape, however. The theory of meaning does not have the central place in philosophy that it did during the 1970s (the time of the fabled "Davidsonic boom", the sound his research program made when it hit Oxford) and the 1980s, and the philosophy of language is itself very different now, with exponentially more papers being published on, say, vagueness than on Davidsonian themes such as radical translation.

The papers I got the most from are those that bring Davidson into dialog with other areas of philosophy and the human sciences. Peter Pagin's "Truth theories, competence, and semantic computation" tackles a familiar question about Truth-theories (T-theories): Can T-theories provide a plausible model of semantic competence? But it tackles that question in an interestingly novel way: How efficiently can T-theories effect semantic computations, relative to measures of time complexity used in classical computational complexity theory. Pagin shows how semantic interpretation in terms of T-theories can be algorithmically represented through term rewriting systems and gives a simplified example to illustrate how T-theories can be of relatively low complexity, thereby putting some meat on the bones of Davidson's frequently repeated claim that T-theories show how an infinite aptitude can be finitely modeled.

Rather different in emphasis, but equally invigorating, is Marga Reimer's "Davidsonian holism in recent philosophy of psychiatry". Reimer challenges the view, which has had some currency among philosophers of psychiatry, that psychiatric delusions undermine the basic Davidsonian principle that rationality is constitutive of thought. Careful attention to the details of the cases (and to what is involved in taking rationality as a constitutive norm of thought) shows, she argues, that subjects can be consistent, rational, and delusional. Psychiatric delusions can be integrated into more or less coherent sets of beliefs (otherwise -- how could they act upon them?), and even when there is inconsistency it falls well short of the type of global error that Davidson took to be ruled out by the nature of interpretation.

There are two interesting papers that do not engage with Davidson directly, although they are clearly on Davidsonian topics. Zoltán Gendler Szabó's "Against logical form" takes issue with what he terms logical hylomorphism, according to which each natural language sentence has a unique form that captures its logical character. Szabó argues that what appear to be formally valid truths are not really true in virtue of logical form. Facts and/or definitions have an ineliminable role to play in determining validity. The line of argument is interesting, but certainly familiar. Clearly, Davidson's overall project is deeply invested in the doctrine of logical form (and for that reason it is puzzling that Szabó's is the only paper in the collection that really speaks to the Davidsonian project of regimenting natural language in a way that will allow a formal truth theory to be applied to it). In this context it would have been more rewarding to see more discussion of how the two triviality objections that Szabó defends would affect Davidson's project of giving truth-theoretic semantics.

William Lycan's "A truth predicate in the object language" also tackles a foundational issue relevant to Davidson's semantic theory -- namely, the possibility of developing a non-contradictory truth theory for a natural language that (like English) contains its own truth predicate. His proposal, which he offers as an alternative to Lepore and Ludwig's reading of Davidson's compressed remarks on the Liar Paradox, is an intriguing variant on the hierarchical approach proposed by Kripke and others. Standard versions of the hierarchical approach deny that the truth predicate is univocal, maintaining instead that 'true' is ambiguous among an infinite number of truth predicates, each of which is appropriate to sentences of a given level. Lycan, in contrast, holds the truth predicate to be univocal, but maintains that English is (contrary to appearances) really an infinite hierarchy of languages, with the truth predicate relativized within the hierarchy. What blocks the paradoxes, Lycan claims, is restricting grammatical applications of the truth predicate to sentences in languages lower in the hierarchy than the sentence in which the truth predicate is applied. The analysis is ingenious, and Lycan applies it to both Liar cycles and Revenge sentences. It does seems a bit of a stretch, though, to include it in a volume on Davidson.

One aspect of Davidson's thought that continues to receive considerable discussion is his claim that "nothing can count as a reason for holding a belief except another belief" -- a claim that, if true, would seem to prevent perceptions and other non-doxastic states from playing any justificatory role. In "Perception and intermediaries" Kathrin Glüer argues that Davidson's claim is in fact compatible with holding that perceptual experiences provide subjects with reasons for belief. On her view, perceptual experience is really a species of belief with a distinctive content -- phenomenal beliefs, whose propositional contents ascribe phenomenal properties to objects. So, for example, my perceptual experience might ascribe the phenomenal property of looking-blue to an object. This is, she claims, sufficiently belief-like to provide warrant for my perceptual belief that the object is indeed blue, while still being sufficiently distinct from the perceptual belief for the perceptual belief to be defeasible. Glüer's strategy may well be the only way of holding Davidson's strong claim without robbing perception of any epistemic contribution. On the face of it, though, it does seem to run into problems with many of the aspects of perceptual experience pointed to by proponents of nonconceptual content (particularly the way in which both the phenomenology and representational content of perception typically outstrip the conceptual, and hence doxastic, repertoire of the perceiving subject). It would have been nice to see this obvious challenge discussed.

Two of the papers (by Bruce Aune and by Steven Gross) are devoted to Davidson's view of first-person authority. Aune focuses on his view that the context of radical interpretation creates a presumption that the interpretee knows what she means by the sentences that she holds true. Gross offers a lengthy discussion of the putative tension that Lepore and Ludwig identify between Davidson's claim that semantic facts are exhausted by evidence available to the radical interpreter, on the one hand, and his belief in first-person authority, on the other. Both papers face an uphill struggle, in my view, given the implausibility and poorly worked out nature of Davidson's thinking in this area -- particularly when contrasted with the many extensive and subtle discussions that there have been of self-knowledge and privileged access in the last twenty or so years. It is unfortunate that neither paper really comes to grips with this literature, or has much to say about the much discussed topic (also originating in Davidson) of how/whether first-person authority can be reconciled with externalism about the content of thought.

Externalism is discussed in Nathaniel Goldberg's "Swampman, response-dependence, and meaning", but from a different perspective -- namely, the apparent tension between the externalist lessons that Davidson draws from the Swampman thought experiment and the general commitment to response-dependence about meaning that seems integral to his understanding of radical interpretation. If radical interpretation is the fundamental standpoint for determining facts about meaning, then why should environmental information potentially unavailable to the radical interpreter rule out Swampman's having thoughts, as Davidson suggests that it does? Goldberg argues that it should not, and that Davidson should have abandoned externalism to preserve the autonomy of radical interpretation. It is hard to disagree with him. At the same time, though, from a philosophical point of view this seems to be getting things exactly the wrong way around. Externalism about content is one of the most thought-provoking features of the contemporary philosophical landscape. The project of radical interpretation is pretty much of purely historical interest, despite the efforts of Olav Gjelsvik ("Knowledge and error: A new approach to radical interpretation") and Richard N. Manning ("Taking back the excitement: Construing 'theoretical concepts' so as to avoid the threat of underdetermination"). So perhaps the correct lesson to draw is that this paper puts another nail in the coffin of radical interpretation.

To conclude, there are some interesting and thought-provoking moments in this collection. But the take-home message (no doubt unintended) is that Davidson's insights and theorizing have far less currency in current analytical philosophy than they did twenty or thirty years ago. It is interesting to compare this volume with two very famous and influential volumes: Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson, edited by Lepore, and Actions and Events: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson, edited by Lepore and Brian McClaughlin. Those two volumes show how central Davidson was at the time (1985 and 1986) to most of the major areas of philosophy (language, epistemology, metaphysics, and mind). In contrast, reading the present volume brings home how much philosophy has moved away (for better or for worse) from those Davidsonian themes that captured the imagination of entire generations of analytic philosophers.