Donald Davidson's Truth-Theoretic Semantics

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Ernest Lepore and Kirk Ludwig, Donald Davidson's Truth-Theoretic Semantics, Oxford University Press, 2007, 346pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199290932.

Reviewed by Pascal Engel, Université de Genève


This is the companion volume to the same authors' Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language and Reality, published with the same press in 2005. The first volume dealt with Davidson's general project of giving a theory of meaning and interpretation, and addressed epistemological and metaphysical issues associated with this project. The present volume is focused on Davidson's semantic program of providing a truth-theoretic account of meaning for natural languages. In the 1970s, some time after the publication of "Truth and Meaning" (1967), "Davidson's program in semantics" became an object of interest (some even said it was a "boom") for philosophers and linguists, and many articles were devoted to Davidson's analysis of adverbs and action sentences and to his views of indirect discourse. Davidson had proposed that a semantic theory of natural language should take the form of a truth-theory obeying convention T and (quasi) Tarskian constraints. Because he emphasised the need for such a theory to be based on a finite number of axioms, to be compositional, and to be able to display the requisite amount of logical structure, his project had a lot of similarities with Chomsky's generative grammar and Montague's semantics, and many philosophers and linguists at that time were equally interested in displaying the "logical form" of natural language sentences. (The volumes Semantics for Natural Languages [Dordrecth, Reidel, 1972] and The Logic of Grammar [Encino, Cal., 1975], edited by Davidson and Gilbert Harman, bear testimony of these hopes, which also surface in some of Davidson's writings of the period, such a "Semantics for Natural Languages" [1970].) In the next decade and up to the present, however, there has been much less concern for this aspect of Davidson's program (it is, for instance, very little represented in Davidson's Library of Living Philosophers volume [L. Hahn ed. Open Court, La salle, 1999]). Davidson's and his reader's interests had shifted from detailed work in semantics to more general issues such as those examined in Lepore and Ludwig's first volume. Why is that so?

Part of the reason for this relative neglect is certainly due to scepticism about the viability of Davidson's project of getting a theory of meaning from a theory of truth.  But that cannot be the only explanation, since the truth-theoretic accounts of various fragments of natural languages should in principle be evaluable independently of Davidson's overall program, as it has indeed been the case with his well-know treatment of adverbial modification and action sentences, which has been accepted by many philosophers who did not subscribe to his general views about meaning. The explanation must lie in the fact that Davidson's proposals about the semantics of other expressions have been less successful than his treatment of adverbs. Another reason has certainly to do with the impression that Davidson's general requirements about truth-theories adapted to natural languages have seemed to be too stringent to be operative. For instance, the requirement that the logic of the metalanguage should not be too much richer than that of the object language, and that it should be, as much as possible, extensional, has certainly created the impression that the exercise was ad hoc when applied to constructions which are obviously intensional, such as modalities and indirect discourse, or not so easily made extensional, such as tense constructions. Another obvious reason for the relative disenchantment with Davidson's style of semantics is that many philosophers of language have been willing to emphasise the non truth-semantical character of many meaning phenomena, particularly in the case of indexicals, speech acts, and other context dependent and pragmatic features of language. There is an austerity, or a form of semantic jansenism, in Davidson's truth- theoretic program of getting the maximum (meaning) out the minimum (truth). But sometimes one feels that Davidson's program acts more as a straightjacket than as a tool of discovery in semantics.

The great interest and merit of L&L's book is that it offers for the first time an extended exposition and treatment of the application of Davidson's semantics to many kinds of natural language expressions. There exists a huge literature in the Davidsonian tradition dealing with a number of semantic constructions, including by L&L themselves, but it is the first time to my knowledge that we get a full book treatment of many of them. The book contains fourteen chapters, three of which deal with the basic framework of Davidson's truth theoretic semantics (ch. 1) and his account of the link between semantic structure and logical form (chs. 13 and 14), the other eleven being devoted to particular kinds of expressions. There are two chapters on quantifiers (ch. 2 and 3), two on names and demonstratives (ch. 4 and 5), one on quotation (ch. 6), one on adjectives and adverbs (ch. 7), three chapters on tense and temporal adverbials (ch. 8-10), one on indirect discourse (ch. 11), and one on non declarative sentences (ch. 12).

I shall not say much about the chapters which present the general framework and Davidson's requirements (compositionality, convention T, logical form, the nature of truth and its relation to meaning). They are very clear, but also very elliptic, and for this reason they will not satisfy a reader expecting a confrontation of Davidson's views with other contemporary views. For instance, in ch. 1 Davidson's argument for not treating meanings as entities are just rehearsed and not analysed, and in ch. 13, on the vexed issue of whether Davidson is closer to a deflationist or a correspondence conception of truth, L&L tell us that:

the sense in which [Davidson's] theory is a correspondence theory is that it explains what it is for sentences to be true not by relating sentences to objects, but by relating predicates and referring terms to objects, speakers and times, via the relations of satisfaction and reference, and exhibiting the conditions under which the sentences are true in virtue of such relations. (p. 323)

But that is a fairly minimalist (and instrumentalist, a truth-theory being mostly, for Davidson, an instrument of measurement of meaning via the assignment of truth conditions) sense of correspondence, which certainly does not allow us to arbitrate on such issues as whether, and how, a theory of truth should be substantial or deflationary. But this is not L&L's concern here. Their main objective is to show how a truth-theoretic framework works for various natural language constructions, and they do it quite well. The chapters on quantifiers provide a very clear statement of a truth theory for ordinary quantifiers and for restricted quantifiers like "most" (extending the treatment given by David Wiggins), and give sample proofs of the theorems of a mini-truth theory (pp. 78-85). In ch. 4 and 5 they show how the truth theoretic framework and Convention T can be extended and relativised to times, places, and other parameters to deal with names and indexicals. In ch. 5 they propose a T-theoretic treatment of complex demonstratives, which have been the focus of much attention in recent semantics and pragmatics, and which they propose, following several recent treatments, to consider as kinds of quantified noun phrases. The chapters on quotation and on adverbs, comparatively, are very sketchy, and mostly summarise Davidson's famous account. I found it surprising that, given the impact that Davidson's semantics of events has had, and the fact that it is the most accepted part of his semantic work, there is not much discussion here of other proposals and frameworks for event sentences. In comparison, the three chapters (8-10) devoted to tense and temporal adverbs are much more developed and contain interesting material, although I cannot deal with it here. Davidson's theory of indirect discourse, and his famous paratactic account of "saying that" according to which attitude sentences are split into a sentence demonstrating an utterance and the demonstrated utterance ("He said that. The earth moves."), are the object of ch.11. L&L show how one can answer several important objections to Davidson's account. In particular they deal with the objection that on Davidson's account it seems hard to paraphrase sentences such as "There is something such that Galileo said that it moves" as "There is something such that Galileo said that. It moves". But their proposal is fairly complex and requires "say that" to have an extra argument place and has problems with the variables. Davidson's treatment of moods, examined in ch. 12, is an extension of his account of indirect discourse. Thus, "Put on your hat" will be rendered as "My next utterance is imperative. You will put on your hat". There should be a more natural analysis of moods than this one!

In each case, L&L display a lot of ingenuity and technical skill in order to accommodate the Davidsonian truth-theoretic framework. But for all this ingenuitiy and skill, the reader cannot help but be left with the impression he had when reading Davidson's initial attempts to fit recalcitrant constructions into his favorite mould, of adding epicycles to the initial semantical conjectures. There are interesting proposals on demonstratives and tense in this book, but in many cases, like those about indirect discourse, the moves are mainly defensive, because Davidson's proposals are artificial. L&L do not pretend, however, to solve all the problems raised by the imposition of the truth theoretic format. For instance there are no accounts of plurals, modalities, or counterfactual conditionals. But their objective was not to cover all kinds of constructions; it was just show how a fairly large amount of natural language could lend itself to such a treatment. In this respect the book is successful.

Its main defect, in my view, lies elsewhere. It lies in the fact that the Davidsonian truth- theoretic format for semantics is assumed from the start, and that most of its chapters are devoted to the task of illustrating and defending, sometimes extending, Davidson's proposals. Because the semantic format is considered as already settled and unrevisable, there is very little in the book which is devoted to a direct confrontation with alternative formats, such as model-theoretic semantics, game-theoretical semantics, or various pragmatic accounts of various phenomena. When in the 1970s Davidson's program appeared, we had a sense of struggle between truth-theoretic and intentionalist conceptions of meaning, between Davidson's and Dummett's programs, or between conceptions of natural language meaning accepting the compositionality requirement and other conceptions rejecting it. L&L do that in part in their previous volume, but most of the time there is little confrontation between their proposal and other rival ones. In that respect, I find books which deal only with one type of construction, such as events, adverbs or anaphora, and which confront various proposals much more instructive. It is true that semantics is now such that there is little room for writers to deal with alternative proposals, and more urgency to develop their own. It is true also that we are at a time when more work has to be devoted to specific proposals than to abstract general programmes, and in that respect this book, which contains a lot which is based on L&L's previous work, advances on more positive ground than Davidson's own proposals thirty years ago. But one may also feel some nostalgia for the pioneering efforts of the 1970s.