Donald Davidson

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Ludwig, Kirk (ed.), Donald Davidson, Cambridge, 2003, 254pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521793823.

Reviewed by Anthony Dardis, Hofstra University



Donald Davidson died August 30, 2003. He was my teacher; he was also my teachers’ teacher (Sue Larson was one of my earliest philosophy instructors, and Bruce Vermazen was on my dissertation committee, along with Davidson and Lotfi Zadeh). My first opportunity to work with him was at UC Berkeley in 1982, the year after he arrived there. I did a directed reading with him of Ned Block’s anthology Philosophy of Psychology. Here’s how we worked. Each week I wrote a précis of the reading. Davidson asked me to read my précis. I read a sentence or two. He stopped me with a question, and that’s as far as we got. I became obsessed with getting clear enough about what I was writing to get beyond the first sentence or two. I never succeeded.

Davidson did not often let on what he was thinking. In his seminars we worked through some tangle of issues, week by week, position by position; at the very end, perhaps the last half hour of the last meeting, he would sketch out something of the way he thought about the issues. This had the pedagogically happy effect of forcing us to work it out for ourselves: some found deep flaws in the pattern of his thinking, others discovered themselves to be “crypto-Davidsonians.”

When Davidson came to UC Berkeley he did not, so far as I know, surf with his graduate students.

Davidson’s work was systematic: views about decision theory turned out to have important consequences for philosophy of language and action theory; views about action theory turned out to have important consequences for the metaphysics of mind and causation; views in philosophy of language turned out to have important consequences for epistemology. Philosophically raised in the heyday of logical positivism, his instincts were, I think, empiricistic and nominalistic; but with the logical positivists he shared a certain sort of Kantian rationalism. His philosophy of language is guided by Quine’s dictum, “language is a social art,” and is, consequently, conditioned by a broadly behavioristic conception of what could possibly count as evidence for a theory of meaning. With Quine he distrusted the analytic/synthetic distinction and the metaphysics they saw as coming with that distinction: propositions, meanings, properties, modality. Davidson found plenty of structure behind the appearances, though. He found something like transcendental arguments for fundamental principles: if one person is able to understand the speech of another, then the other must by and large be rational, a believer of truths and a lover of the good (in “Mental Events” he called principles like these “synthetic a priori”). Like Frege and Russell, he thought one core way to solve philosophical problems is through the logical form of our talk, which is often remarkably different from the form it first suggests itself as having: Davidson showed us that sentences about what people do turn out to be about events, and that sentences about what people think and say turn out covertly to be two sentences rather than one, with one pointing at the other. Above all, what might have appeared to be small issues turn out to have fundamental consequences for the most central philosophical questions: truth, the nature of minds and meaning, our knowledge of the external world.

This Book

This book is part of the “Contemporary Philosophy in Focus” series published by Cambridge University Press. The intent of the series is similar to that of their “Cambridge Companions to Philosophy” series: to provide a collection of essays (on an important philosopher; on a central area in philosophy) that constitutes an overview and introduction, and resources for serious further work. They are primarily resources for advanced undergraduates and beginning graduate students, and for anyone who wants to get up to speed in contemporary discussions. They are not collections of cutting-edge essays at the cusp of the current dialectic, but are rather intended to get someone into a position to see what’s going on there.

This book fulfils the intent admirably. There are seven essays by philosophers who are known for their writing on Davidson’s work (and well known for much else besides). They address the key areas in which Davidson has made fundamental contributions: philosophy of language, philosophy of action, philosophy of mind, metaphysics and epistemology. Each author, in varying ways, achieves a (somewhat tense) balance between exposition of Davidson’s positions and summary of current criticism. Each essay provides voluminous references to the state of current investigations. The book provides also a complete bibliography of Davidson’s publications, plus a selected bibliography of commentaries on Davidson’s work. It is clearly a very useful book for anyone thinking about Davidson. It could be used for a semester-long course on Davidson’s thought (although there’s probably too much here to cover in one semester); and each essay on its own would be very useful to read in conjunction with Davidson’s and others’ writings on the relevant topics. As Ludwig notes in his “Introduction,” Davidson’s “essays are elegant, but they are also noted for their compact, sometimes cryptic style, and for their difficulty.” There is no substitute for working through Davidson’s own writing, but this anthology will be a real help for those coming to it for the first time.

The Essays

Kirk Ludwig, “Introduction” Ludwig’s introduction provides a remarkably complete overview of Davidson’s intellectual biography. It begins more or less at the beginning (born in Springfield, Massachusetts in 1917, moved to Staten Island in 1924 … ) and then describes the development of Davidson’s ideas in just about every area in which he has made significant contributions: theories of meaning and natural-language semantics; philosophy of action; radical interpretation; philosophy of psychology; epistemology; events; truth; rationality and irrationality; and non-literal uses of language.

Ernest Lepore and Kirk Ludwig, “Truth and Meaning” Lepore and Ludwig step clearly and methodically through Davidson’s project of treating the semantics of natural languages in terms of truth. They begin with the thought that meaning must be compositional: if we were unable to figure out the meanings of more complex stretches of language on the basis of our knowledge of meanings of less complex stretches, we would not be able to master the languages we do master, since our mastery involves the ability to figure out the meanings of infinitely many sentences.

Compositionality has immediate consequences for a theory of meaning. If we associate meanings with terms, that is to say, special sorts of entities, like Platonic Forms, we haven’t yet explained how knowledge of the meanings of shorter stretches of language gets us to knowledge of longer stretches (since simply stacking two of these entities alongside one another doesn’t seem to reveal what the meaning of the compound expression is). There is, however, a straightforward way to explain how complex meanings depend on the meanings of the parts, one we learned from Tarski’s recursive specification of a theory of truth for a language: give a rule that specifies the meaning of a complex in terms of the meanings of its parts. The rule supplants any need for meanings as entities in the world. Frege all but saw how to do this, but he got sidetracked by the thought that just as names refer to individuals, whole sentences must refer to some entity. Davidson gives what has been dubbed “the slingshot” argument against any such proposal; Lepore and Ludwig give a thorough and very helpful explication of the argument and difficulties for it.

Davidson’s innovation in “Truth and Meaning” was to point out that Tarski’s recursive definition of truth for a formal language has the right form for such a rule for meanings for sentences. Tarski had imposed a criterion of adequacy on any successful definition of truth for a language: it must entail a theorem for each sentence in the language, a theorem that pairs a description of the sentence with a sentence that states its truth condition—that is, sentences of the famous form “(T) S is true if and only if p.” As Davidson pointed out later, where Tarski takes our understanding of meaning as basic and explicates truth for a language, Davidson takes our understanding of truth as basic and explicates meaning.

This bare proposal, made in 1967, points at two important areas of research. First, perhaps more fundamental, there is work to do to defend the connection between a theory of truth and a theory of meaning. For instance, early discussions focused on what someone would have to know, in addition to knowing such a theory, in order to be able to interpret the sentences of the language. Second, we need to figure out how actually to derive T-theorems for real constructions in natural languages, since the whole project founders if somehow the truth-theoretic account fails for some real construction—for instance for the sentences that are neither true nor false.

On the first issue, Davidson claimed that an extensionally adequate theory (one such that all the T-theorem biconditionals are in fact true) would suffice for interpretation; but this is clearly incorrect. Davidson’s developing treatment of the issue leads into what he termed “radical interpretation” (discussed in this volume by Piers Rawling, see below). Lepore and Ludwig review the literature on the question whether Davidson’s focus on radical interpretation can settle these questions about whether a truth-theory really does provide a theory of meaning.

Lepore and Ludwig note that the second project, working out truth-theoretic semantical theories, can proceed even if Davidson was wrong on this point. They note also that although Davidson himself took the concept of truth to be basic and irreducible, one can pursue truth-theoretic semantics using pretty much any concept of truth one chooses. Lepore and Ludwig discuss two of Davidson’s contributions to truth-theoretic semantics: work on action sentences and adverbial modification, and his paratactic account of indirect discourse, of quotation, and of nondeclarative sentences.

Alfred R. Mele, “Philosophy of Action” In 1963 Davidson published “Actions, Reasons and Causes,” in which he opposed what he called “a very strong neo-Wittgensteinian current of small red books” (published by Routledge and Kegan Paul, arguing that reasons explanation is not causal explanation) with a causalist account of actions: an action is a bodily movement caused by reasons. As Mele points out, Davidson never gives a positive argument for causalism; instead, he issues a challenge for any non-causalist alternative, one that Mele claims has not been successfully met: to explain which reason, among the reasons that an agent might have that rationalize an action, is the agent’s reason for performing the action.

According to causalism, reasons explanation is a special kind of causal explanation, since it must rationalize the action, that is, show it reasonable in light of the agent’s thoughts and values. A good deal of recent philosophy of action consists in working out the precise configuration of reasons, thoughts, values and other attitudes that are required for a reasons explanation of an action. For instance, Davidson holds that all intentional actions are done for reasons, yet it seems that some actions (actions done purely for their own sake, actions done “for no reason at all”) may not be done for reasons. Mele indicates some of the parties to this dispute and a way out for Davidson.

Causalism, like any account of action, owes us an explanation of weakness of will: if reasons explanations rationalize actions, how can an agent act against her own reasons? Davidson’s answer is that one’s practical reasoning may result in a “conditional” or “all things considered” judgment that it is better, for instance, just this once to stay in bed rather than to get out of bed to brush one’s teeth, yet one’s reasons for brushing one’s teeth cause an “unconditional” judgment to get out of bed (Davidson’s example, designed in part to counter the long history of confusing the issue of weakness of will with moral weakness). Davidson came to identify such unconditional or “all out” judgments with intentions, so that akratic action involves failure to form intentions that accord with one’s best judgment. Mele points out that there are still difficulties: that it may be possible to act akratically even when one has, in accord with one’s best judgment, formed an intention to act in a certain way.

Causalism seems to impinge badly on freedom: if my actions have to be caused by my reasons, then aren’t my actions all non-free parts of the causal nexus? Davidson is a compatibilist, and his concerns about freedom start from this basis. He has two main concerns: whether freedom to act is a causal power of the agent; and whether the existence of strict laws linking all causally related events contradicts freedom. On the first issue, J.L. Austin attacked causalism on the ground that freedom to act couldn’t be a causal power. Davidson argues that the attack fails, but concedes and embraces the basis of the attack, that it is not possible to give a causal analysis of intentional action (in particular, that it is not possible to give a causally sufficient condition for someone’s acting intentionally). The key difficulty is the problem of so-called “deviant causal chains”: a person may have reasons that rationalize an action, and the reasons cause the action, but they do so “in the wrong way”. Davidson pointed out that causalism is consistent with the failure of the analysis. (Recent work on the analysis of dispositions follows his lead on this point.) Since there is no analysis, there are no analytic laws of behaviour. If causalism is correct, then, it would seem, there must be non-analytic causal laws linking reasons and actions. Davidson agrees, but argues (in “Mental Events”) that these laws cannot use the language of intentional psychology, and hence that there are no laws linking reasons and behavior. That argument constitutes his second defense of compatibilism: even though there is a strict law linking an action with the reasons that cause it, there is not and cannot be a law that picks out the reasons and actions as reasons and actions, and to that extent psychology is anomalous, not governed by law. Whether this defense succeeds is closely connected to the “epiphenomenalism” issue raised by Jaegwon Kim’s essay, below.

Piers Rawling, “Radical Interpretation” Davidson holds that the concepts of meaning, truth, belief, desire, intention are interrelated, and that the whole package of concepts is not reducible to any set of concepts other than these. But it is possible to give an illuminating account of the concepts by displaying the structure of their relations. Suppose we grant Davidson that a compositional theory of truth, viewed appropriately, can serve as a theory of meaning. If we can relate a theory of truth to a particular person, that is, display a structure of relations between a particular person and a theory of truth, we might gain further illumination about the concept of meaning. Hence Davidson’s guiding question for developing the idea of radical interpretation: “What would it suffice an interpreter to know in order to understand the speaker of an alien language, and how could he come to know it?” The question is doubly hypothetical; the point isn’t to spell out how people actually interpret one another. Instead, we are looking to see whether certain things must be true of meaning for any kind of interpretation, including radical interpretation, to be possible.

Rawling’s essay begins by tracing the history of aspects of Davidson’s suggested answer to the question. Frank Ramsey invented a technique for teasing a numeric measure of degrees of belief and of subjective utility from behavioral data, but only on the assumption that the overall pattern of belief and utility is rational. Tarski, of course, invented the idea of a compositional theory of truth. Quine urged that “language is a social art” and sought a conception of meaning consistent with what he took to be the austerely behavioristic data on which translation must be based. Quine’s idea of radical translation relies on a structural constraint similar to Ramsey’s: since language is a social art, meaning must be available to be translated; translation is impossible if there is radical illogicality; therefore radical illogicality is impossible, that is, speakers must in some fundamental way be logical.

Rawling usefully summarizes the dispute between Quine and Davidson on whether the behavioral data supporting a translation scheme or an interpretive truth theory should be proximal or distal: data about the surface of the speaker, as opposed to data involving things in the world. Quine held that it should be proximal, because he held that we “reify” or construct the objects of experience out of the stream of experiential data. Davidson held that it should be distal (we get to count, say, relations between a speaker and a presented rabbit as among the data) because that gives an elegant answer to the following question: how is it that the properties and relations represented in thought are the very same properties and relations that are instantiated in the world?

Radical interpretation is indeterminate, since if there is one interpretive theory of truth that fits the data then there are infinitely many. Davidson is often accused of instrumentalism about psychology, since, apparently, there is no reason to pick one of these ways of interpreting rather than any other. Davidson holds that this indeterminacy no more impugns the factuality or reality of the attitudes than does the fact that there are infinitely many ways to measure temperature impugns the reality of temperature. Rawling argues that the analogy with the measurement of temperature is flawed. When we measure temperature, there is a phenomenon in the world, mean molecular kinetic energy, and we can pick any one of infinitely many ways to map that phenomenon into the numbers. When we “measure” propositional attitudes, by contrast, there is no fixed stock of attitudes that we map into our sentences. The overall pattern of behavior is a fixed phenomenon in the world, but it is up to the interpreter to posit a particular configuration of attitudes to explain the behavior. (In this respect Davidson is Quinean about the attitudes: they are a product of “reification” on the part of the theorizer.) Something has to give: either indeterminacy, or the idea that the existence of the propositional attitudes cannot outrun the evidence for their attribution. The former is well-supported, and the latter turns out to be dispensable; it remains to be seen how well this comports with Quine’s manifesto that language is a social art.

Jaegwon Kim, “Philosophy of Mind and Psychology” Davidson’s anomalous monism holds that that all things are physical things, but that there are no strict laws concerning any intentional psychological properties. Kim reminds us just how revolutionary the idea was when it was first introduced in 1970, since up to that point just about every philosophy of mind (dualism, interactionism, occasionalism, and recent views like the identity theory of mind) assumed that there are nomic connections between the mind and the body. Kim holds that although it has been difficult to spell Davidson’s argument out in detail, there is a way to understand it “on which psychophysical anomalism is at least presumptively credible” (118). Psychology is governed by a constitutive ideal of rationality, i.e., the structural constraints on interpretation noted above, what Davidson in “Mental Events” called “synthetic a priori principles”. This constitutive ideal does not govern physical states; physical theory is governed by its own constitutive ideals. Kim’s suggestion is that the existence of strict laws would “transmit” the constitutive ideals of each domain to the other, and so are impossible. Davidson clearly thinks of the difference of the two kinds of constitutive ideals as key to the argument; he may have intended to deploy the difference in different ways.

As Kim points out, anomalous monism has shaped large scale features of the discussion of the mind body problem for the last 30 years. It is one of a family of non-reductive physicalist positions: attractive both for their commitment to physicalism and as well for the distance they allow between the physical and the mental. Davidson himself advertised his position for its ability to meet Kant’s challenge, of showing how we can be simultaneously part of the natural order, and also free and autonomous agents.

Kim elsewhere has made philosophers of mind appreciate the threat of epiphenomenalism to non-reductive physicalism, and here rehearses the difficulty for Davidson’s position. Anomalous monism says that every mental event is a physical event, and argues for this conclusion on the basis of the assumption that mental events have causal relations with physical events. Yet the anomalism of the position seems to entail that the mental features of mental events have little or nothing to do with their physical features, and in particular that the mental features of mental events have nothing to do with the causal relations that obtain between mental events. Hence a serious challenge for Davidson’s position, and any non-reductive physicalism: how to explain the appearance that mental properties are causally efficacious—that when, for instance, I raise my arm, my reasons cause my arm to go up because they are the reasons they are (rather than because my reasons have the physical properties they have). Even worse, epiphenomenalism looks bad for freedom: if my reasons never cause bodily movements because they are the reasons they are, but only cause them because they are physical events, my contribution to the production of my actions seems to have completely vanished.

Paul Pietroski, “Semantics and Metaphysics of Events” Davidson’s philosophies of action and mind depend on thinking of actions and (the onset of) propositional-attitude mental states as events. Pietroski’s contribution reviews Davidson’s argument that action sentences are best analyzed as quantifications over events, and Davidson’s contributions to the metaphysics of events. In “The Logical Form of Action Sentences” Davidson argues for a conception of the logical form of sentences about actions, such as ’Brutus stabbed Caesar on the Ides of March’: these should be construed as sentences about events. The argument focuses on how to treat logical entailments that we find in natural language. The sentence above entails ’Brutus stabbed Caesar’ and ’A stabbing occurred on the Ides of March’. The pattern of such entailments is complex and “multiple”: we can talk about stabbings, stabbings done by a certain person, stabbings suffered by a person, stabbings done at a certain time, in a certain place, done in a certain way, done with certain intents, or with certain instruments, etc., etc. Davidson argues that the best way to account for the entailments is to assign a form according to which the sentences predicate many things about one event. Then these many entailments have a simple explanation, namely, conjunction elimination: if there is an event that is a stabbing of Caesar, and is a stabbing by Brutus, and is a stabbing that occurred on the Ides of March, then there is an event that is a stabbing that occurred on the Ides of March.

Pietroski scouts a few modifications that might be made to the basic idea. Sentences with plural subjects or plural objects (“3 linguists taught 4 philosophers 5 theories”) present difficulties not considered by Davidson, but which may be soluble along roughly Davidsonian lines. Rather more worrisome to Davidson’s project is the idea that actions are not simply bodily movements, but an “accordion” of events that starts with a bodily movement. For instance, Davidson endorses the idea that the bodily movement that was the stabbing of Caesar was the bodily movement that was the killing of Caesar, and so seems to have to say that the killing of Caesar caused the death of Caesar. The issues here depend on sorting out both what actions are and what the logical form of action sentences is.

Pietroski ends by reviewing Davidson’s efforts at saying what events are. Initially Davidson rejected a spatiotemporal criterion of event identity, since he held that more than one event can transpire at the same time and place; in its place he put a causal criterion, so that a and b are the same event if and only if they have the same causes and effects. Quine objected that this definition is impredicative, since causes and effects presumably are further events; in response Davidson moved back toward Quine’s own proposal of a spatiotemporal criterion.

Ernest Sosa, “Knowledge of Self, Others, and World” Davidson argues from radical interpretation to the conclusion that our knowledge of our own mental states, our knowledge of the world around us, and our knowledge of the minds of those with whom we communicate, are all justified on approximately the same basis and are equally justified. From this it follows that our true beliefs about the world constitute knowledge. As Sosa points out, this is a truly astonishing conclusion: if it can be sustained, it provides a neat response to at least 350 years of philosophical concern about skepticism about our knowledge of the external world.

Sosa begins by noting another surprising feature of Davidson’s thought about epistemology: any account of knowledge that finds a realm of evidence that is untainted by connection with the external world, whether that realm is the realm of thoughts available to introspection, or the realm of surface stimulations, is doomed to skepticism, since there will always remain an unbridgeable logical gap between that untainted realm and the realm of facts in the world. This problem obviously plagues Cartesian epistemology, but it is a problem shared by Quine and Dummett and any verificationist theory, as well as by “contemporary externalists, coherentists and naturalists” (165).

Davidson’s answer is that interpretation requires that a speaker must, by and large, be talking about the facts about the world around her, since it is those facts that set the correct interpretation of her words. Sosa discusses Stroud’s response to this thought (that interpretation only requires that the interpreter does not see the speaker as massively incorrect about the world) and concludes that Stroud is, after all, wrong to think that this weaker reading is enough to block the skeptic. Sosa returns to the externalist strand of Davidson’s radical interpretation and concludes that Davidson’s account of linguistic meaning and propositional attitude content might be best construed as an account of how meaning in fact depends on our relation to the world: that the argument is not, after all, an a priori argument that reasons from the nature of beliefs that the reasoner knows she has.

Sosa ends with a discussion of the way Davidson’s argument provides justification and hence underwrites knowledge. Davidson came to realize that his argument can only be deployed to provide justification by a philosophically sophisticated reasoner. But clearly the idea should be more broad in application. We should recognize that the argument is based on the nature of meaning and propositional-attitude content, and hence the truth of its conclusion provides a sort of “external reason” that anyone has. That reason, together with one’s own more or less coherent and mutually reinforcing beliefs, can be seen as adding up to knowledge. Sosa observes that this structure of justification is shared by Descartes. At the end of the Meditations the meditator has two forms of justification for her beliefs: that they cohere in a regular and justificatory way; and the guarantee, uncovered in the Third Meditation, that a certain kind of coherent pattern of belief will correspond to fact.

Samuel Wheeler III, “Language and Literature” We use our spoken languages to communicate ordinary mundane matters of fact, and to construct texts or documents that convey ordinary mundane matters of fact. Happily, we also use our languages for all sorts of other purposes. Wheeler’s essay discusses (among others) three main areas in which Davidson’s philosophy of language is interesting and provocative to philosophers of literature, language and culture: his “no language” thesis, the nature of meaning, and metaphor.

Davidson is infamous for concluding (“A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs”) that there is no such thing as a language. On the view that Davidson opposes, a speaker learns and uses a public language. The references of the lexical items and the structure and significance of the grammatical constructions in the public language is something that is set prior to the speaker’s learning and using them. Davidson acknowledges that we do often use words with meanings that they had prior to our use of them. He argues that we don’t have to, and that in fact we frequently do not. A host of examples shows that we can make words up or use words in non-standard ways, and succeed perfectly well in communication. According to Davidson, it is possible (if perhaps not for us) for each of two speakers to use sets of sounds and marks that are distinct from those used by any other speaker (including the other of the two) and still manage to communicate with each other. Since as a matter of actual fact each language user’s linguistic abilities and dispositions do differ subtly from every other’s, the existence of a “language” like English or Urdu is an abstraction from a vague overlap of a large number of such idiolects. Wheeler points out that such a conclusion does not damage literary analysis that depends on the idea of some standard structure that a given author bends to her purposes. If a poet violates the “rules” for writing a sonnet, we don’t have to understand the existence of these rules in a terrifically robust way. It’s enough if there is a history of texts and mutual expectations, and for a given poet to make use of this history in some interesting way.

As Lepore and Ludwig note in Essay 1 of this book, one key to understanding Davidson’s work in the semantics of natural languages is the argument that meanings play no particular role in semantical theory. Recent work in literary theory, particularly that of Jacques Derrida, places great weight on a similar observation. Fregean senses, Platonic ideas, social languages, and any number of other ideas about how language works, all start by assuming what Wheeler calls (following Derrida) “self interpreting logoi” that is, items that carry their meaning intrinsically and independently of communication. Derrida and Davidson turn out to agree that what we call meaning is a function of speaker’s dispositions to use words in concrete circumstances, in particular in a culture that has a tradition of using those words in similar ways in similar circumstances. They disagree on the point concerning languages: Derrida thinks of meaning as always determined by changing cultural circumstances, and hence that language is in a sense prior to its speakers, whereas Davidson thinks of meaning as determined by what individual speakers do with their words in communication. Ian Hacking called Davidson a “duettist”: the fundamental linguistic unit is a pair of speakers communicating, rather than a society.

Davidson’s key move on metaphor is to separate semantics from pragmatics. Metaphors seem to convey some special sort of meaning, and many theories of metaphor work from this appearance. Davidson’s view is that metaphors mean what their words (in combination) mean, nothing more, nothing less. What metaphors do, by contrast, is provide illumination: they provoke hearers and readers into seeing connections they hadn’t seen before. It follows from this understanding of metaphor that metaphor cannot be the primary phenomenon for understanding language: literal meaning, or what Davidson terms “first meaning”, must be fundamental.