Donald Davidson's Triangulation Argument, A Philosophical Inquiry

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Robert H. Myers and Claudine Verheggen, Donald Davidson's Triangulation Argument, A Philosophical Inquiry, Routledge, 2016, 214 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415710275.

Reviewed by Pascal Engel, Ecole des Hautes Ètudes en Sciences Sociales


Towards the end of his philosophical career, Donald Davidson put much emphasis on what he called "triangulation", the thesis that only someone who has interacted linguistically with another person and the world they share could have language and objective thought. Davidson tended to reformulate a number of his doctrines, in particular about the nature of interpretation, in terms of this triangulation argument (henceforth "TA") and drew a few striking consequences from it. First, he derived from TA an argument against skepticism: if a shared and public world is the precondition of all thought, and if belief by its very nature is veridical, then skepticism is undercut. Second, Davidson associated with TA the idea that knowledge of one's mental states, knowledge of other minds and knowledge of an objective world, although different varieties of knowledge, are strongly connected to each other, and, in some sense, all of a piece. Third, he derived from TA a realistic account of values. Claudine Verheggen and Robert Myers present and evaluate this argument and its purported consequences. I shall first give a general overview of the book, then discuss some of the specific claims it makes.

The first part, authored by Verheggen, gives a presentation and defense of TA. She insists, in the first chapter, on the fact that TA is the view that the successful interpretation of propositional attitudes, of meanings and of contents presupposes not only the existence of at least two agents, each responding in similar ways to similar features of a shared environment, but that interpretation also presupposes the very concept of objectivity. This also goes the other way round: only if one triangulates with others can one have the concept of objectivity. In the second chapter, she connects TA to the problem of the normativity of meaning. Normativity, she argues, is a consequence of Davidson's non-reductionism -- meaning is normative because it cannot be reductively naturalized. But it is also tightly connected to TA: unless one can distinguish correct from incorrect uses of words, one cannot have the concept of objectivity, and therefore one cannot have language and thoughts.

Verheggen sorts out a second sense of normativity, which has to do with whether statements about the meaning of words have normative implications, regarding whether one ought to use them in such and such a way. These implications, Veregghen argues, exist, but they are hypothetical, not categorical. Another consequence of TA, examined in chapter 3, is a form of externalism, both about meaning and about thought: if the latter are fixed by the relationships that a subject has both with other subjects and with the environment, then the external environment plays a role in the individuation of meaning. By "environment," Davidson meant not only the physical, but also the historical environment. Chapter 4 explains the ties between TA and Davidson's refutation of skepticism.

The second part of the book, by Myers, deals with the practical side of Davidson's thought about objectivity and with his meta-ethical views. Chapter 5 raises for normative truths a problem parallel to the problem of the objectivity of meaning and thought: are there normative truths about what people have reasons to do? Normative skepticism, which is often presented as Hume's position, says that there cannot be objective practical reasons, and that motivation is based on desires. Davidson is often presented as a Humean, who takes reasons to consist in beliefs and desires which cause actions, and as a normative skeptic.

Chapter 6 argues that this is wrong: Davidson is not a normative skeptic. In several papers (in particular Davidson 1984, 1995) he formulates an argument to the effect that the conditions of interpretation are such that not only beliefs are, on the whole, bound to be true, but also are such that desires and values are bound to be objective. The argument, which rests on Davidson's holism about beliefs and desires, is meant to secure a form of realism about values. Myers argues that Davidson's objectivism about values makes room for normative beliefs having a motivational power, and that it has much in common with Scanlon's (1998, 2014) view of "judgment sensitive" attitudes and reasons. Chapter 7 addresses the kind of worries raised against normative realism (by Korsgaard, Mackie, and Harman) about the authority and motivational power of normative reasons. Chapter 8 reinforces the comparison between Davidson's views of moral reasons and Scanlon's contractualism, and argues that the latter is where Davidson should have ended up.

Although the book draws on previously published articles, it displays a strong unity, the common thread being Davidson's TA, and the form of objectivism that, according to the authors, one can derive from it, both for the nature of thought and meaning and for ethics. The originality and interest of this book are twofold. First, it gives an assessment of the importance of Davidson's TA, which many commentators have tended to overlook or to consider as a mere reformulation of his previous views on interpretation. Second, it draws attention to his much neglected views on metaethics and confronts them with recent work in this field. I shall comment on both aspects.

Claudine Verheggen gives a detailed analysis of the emergence of TA in Davidson's philosophy during the last twenty years of his life. She correctly points out that the argument, and the distinctive kinds of semantic and social externalism that he defends, inherit from his earlier theory of meaning and of interpretation, but also that they are driven by two concerns which did not figure prominently in his earlier work: accounting for the causal relation between speakers and their environment,and articulating an argument to the effect that the conditions of interpretation provide the main premises for an account of objectivity. TA is, in Davidson's elegant but elliptical articles, often elusive. It consists in "the mutual and simultaneous responses of two or more creatures to distal stimuli and to one another's responses" (Davidson 2001: xv). Very often, Davidson talks as if "responses" here meant only "linguistic responses", and "responses within an interpretation procedure" of the kind which he describes most of the time in his previous work. Then the TA argument much resembles the argument in earlier papers like "Thought and Talk" (1975, in Davidson 1985), where Davidson argues that one cannot have meanings and objective thoughts unless one is an interpreter, a condition which animals lack.

Clearly, the TA often moves in this direction, in the form of a transcendental argument: there could not be meanings, beliefs and objective thought unless one had been involved in a process of interpreting others. As many critics have observed, especially about the parallel argument that Davidson advanced about animal beliefs (Davidson 1982), this seems to put too much weight on language: assuming that animals do not have language, why would they thereby lack the concept of objectivity? Davidson, as Verheggen points out, is not so radical. He accepts that there is "primitive triangulation" in animals, in children and in solitary individuals who have no means to engage in triangulation through linguistic exchange. But the best that they can do is to rely on perception in order to trace similarities between the causes of their perceptual stimuli. Primitive triangulation may be necessary for individuating the objects of perception, but it is not sufficient. Only linguistic triangulation, according to Davidson, can achieve this and can provide the relevant patterns of agreement and disagreement which are able to ground the sense of an objective world outside the individual.

Many philosophers have been puzzled by these claims. They have questioned the assumption that triangulation is needed for fixing meanings, and wondered whether animals might have a grasp of an objective world without having the means of communicate with others. Thus, work in animal cognition shows that rats and a lot of other animals are able to form maps of their environment, and that animals have the capacity to correct their perceptual errors by recalibrating their initial information (Proust 1999). Verheggen objects that such primitive proto-thought will not provide the aspects under which objects are individuated, and hence the fine grained conceptual differences which are needed for meanings and for a full-blown sense of an objective world. The problem here, as she notes, is that Davidson's argument is a priori, and does not address the kind of claims which psychologists have made about the formation of concepts and perception.

Another problem with TA is that, although Davidson tries to address the problems of perceptual externalism, he does not depart from his suspicion that introducing contents of perception and experiences would entail reintroducing some kind of intermediaries between subjects and the world. He has always tended to think of the relation between perceptions and their objects as a merely causal one. Another objection to TA has been that it seems circular: Davidson says both that possessing the concept of objectivity is a precondition of language and thought, and that possession of the latter is a precondition of the former. Verheggen answers:

It is obviously not just the narrow vicious circle that there is language and thought only when there is language and thought. It is rather the rich and complex circle that encompasses language, thought (each of which depending on there being fixed meanings), possession of the concept of objectivity and linguistic triangulation. (p. 35)

But how rich and complex is the circle, and how much does it encompass? If it is too rich, the argument is lost.

In chapter 3, Verheggen deals with the question whether meaning is normative. She argues that meaning is essentially normative, not for the familiar Wittgenstein-Kripke reasons which are supposed to entail that meaning cannot be reduced to dispositions, but the other way round: it is because meaning cannot be so reduced that it is normative. She develops this argument by discussing a proposal by Hannah Ginsborg, according to which meaning is based on primitive normative attitudes. Her objections seem to me correct, but they fail to address the issue which a number of commentators of Davidson have addressed: is there room, on his conception of thought and language, for a substantive notion of normativity of content and meaning, one which could derive non-hypothetical oughts from our use of semantic expressions?

Davidson himself denied that there is any normativity to meaning and thought beyond the rational principles of interpretation, and a number of his followers have argued that claims about normativity of meaning and content are either trivial or empty. Verheggen agrees with them only to the extent that she admits a hypothetical form of normativity: a user of language has to care whether her words are correct, if she wants to communicate. Normativity is needed only in the attitudes of the speaker and not, in particular, in conventions about meanings.  As chapter 4 correctly points out, Davidson's perceptual externalism is neither the environmental one which Putnam once defended, nor the social one which Burge once defended. Still, a substantive normativity requires more; it requires that there be objective and categorical correctness conditions for beliefs and other attitudes, and not only hypothetical ones. Davidson was not prepared to go in this direction. He denied that truth is the norm of belief (Davidson 1999), and he has been followed by a number of writers who reject claims about the normativity of content and of attitudes.

Chapter 4 deals with the baffling argument that radical interpretation and triangulation yield anti-skepticism. The argument is baffling because, as Stroud (1999) and a number of other critics have argued, the fact that interpretation (or for that matter triangulation) presupposes that most of our beliefs are true, or that belief attribution is largely veridical, does not entail that most of our beliefs are true. Even if, as Davidson does, we invoke the notoriously strange "omniscient interpreter", the skeptical doubt is not put to rest.

Verheggen's answer on behalf of Davidson consists, here again, in pointing out that the anti-skeptical argument from interpretation is a transcendental one: given the conditions of interpretation, the skeptical hypothesis does not even make sense, for, if our beliefs are supposed to be contentful, they are by and large true. But even if we grant this, it still does not follow that we have knowledge, which is what the skeptic asks for. Even if we did have knowldege, we don’t know that we do. Davidson, however, says that this demand is too strong: if knowledge of knowledge is what the skeptic demands, we do not have it: he asks more than what is intelligible (p.108). There is a move which Davidson could make here: take the basic attitude in interpretation and in triangulation to be knowledge, rather than belief and true belief (Williamson 2004). This would undercut skepticism from the start, but it would give to interpretation and triangulation a form which Davidson could not accept.

While Davidson rejects substantive conceptions of normativity in the epistemic and in the semantic realm, he is prepared to accept a form of realism about values in the practical realm. This is by no means obvious, given his views on reasons and causes, and his early works in moral psychology, about weakness of will and about Hume's theory of pride. In 1963 and in much of his further work until 1990, it was clear that he took reasons for action to be mental states composed of belief and desires, that he defended a version of the Humean theory of motivation. It was tempting to infer that he espoused also some form of anti-realism about values.

But he actually does not, and provides for desires and values an argument parallel to his argument about meanings and beliefs. Just as the constraints on interpretation are such that our beliefs are by and large true and about an objective reality, these constraints also entail that there are objective standards to which our desires and evaluative judgments are answerable. Skepticism about value is ruled out just as is external world skepticism. This theme emerged in Davidson's articles in the early eighties when he proposed a "unified theory of meaning and action" and generalized it to desires and values. But it became an explicit argument about the objectivity of values only in his 1995 article on the objectivity values. Robert Myers was the first to attract attention to this neglected theme in his early articles, and he spells out fully here the grounds of Davidson's moral realism. He shows that, although Davidson accepted what is called the "Humean theory of motivation" (motivation goes by way of desires and not by way of beliefs), he did not accept what he calls "the Humean theory of pro-attitudes", which denies that our actions respond to reasons which are objective and that there are normative truths about what people have reasons to do. In other words, our pro-attitudes, mostly our desires, are not mere dispositions to do whatever we believe will increase our chances of getting what we want by doing a certain kind of action. But how far can Davidson go in the direction of a full-blown moral realism?

Davidson's claim is that if agents are to be interpretable, they must share values which are largely similar to ours, correct, and objective. Even if we agree that this works for beliefs, the argument is less straightforward for desires. Prima facie it should not be, for Davidson says that we must interpret beliefs and desires jointly. Any interpretation of belief has to go through an interpretation of desires as well. Davidson insists on the fact that the patterns of desires in agents are just as holistic as the patterns of their beliefs, and that the patterns actually depend on each other when we interpret actions. But, as Myers remarks, this dependency of the interpretation of desires on the interpretation of beliefs, and in turn on the interpretation of speech, does nothing by itself to show that there is a parallel argument for desires. At best, what it shows is that the argument from interpretation applies to desires and beliefs.

But how can we apply the argument to those desires which are, in some sense, revealing of values held by an agent? What people individually desire can differ hugely from person to person. It's this fact which gives rise to the problem of interpersonal comparisons of utility, a problem with which Davidson also dealt (see his 1986 essay on this topic reprinted in Davidson 2004). Prima facie, what is needed for objectivity is at least some convergence of individual values susceptible to being shared by agents, and possibly an agreement on these values. How do we reach such a convergence? Clearly, it is much harder to discern holistic patterns of desires within an agent than it is to discern such patterns for beliefs. If one ascribes to an agent the belief that a cloud is passing over the sun, it is natural to ascribe the belief that opaque objects can hide a source of light. But if one can ascribe to an agent a desire to eat ice cream, it is hard to ascribe a desire, say, to eat strawberry ice cream, or to eat an ice cream cake. Interpretation must presuppose that agents are aiming at what is good in general. So only "enlightened desires" about what one believes to be good will do, not passing fancies, such as the sudden desire to touch a woman’s elbow (Davidson 1980: 3). The desires that can be the basis of interpretation have to be evaluative desires, involving not simply an attitude of an agent towards an object, but also the belief that a certain object is valuable. In other words, they must be normative desires that have propositional contents to the effect that such and such is desirable and valuable.

But even if we concentrate on enlightened desires, what guarantee do we have that we shall converge on our values? It seems that what would be needed would be an equivalent of the principle of charity for desires. Sometimes, Davidson seems to suggest that there is such a principle: "In our need to make him make sense we will try for a theory that finds him consistent, a believer of truths, and a lover of the good (all by our own lights it goes without saying)" (Davidson 1980: 222). But even if there were such a principle, it would function, like the principle of charity for beliefs, as an a priori principle of interpretation. Although such a principle is, by definition, supposed to be necessary, this would not yield a convergence on the objectivity of values. So, the whole weight of this convergence is carried by the holistic requirements on the interpretation of beliefs and desires. It implies that we have criteria of convergence and of divergence when we disagree on values. But how do we get these criteria? The criteria for evaluation of disagreements over, for instance, the concept of "justice" are themselves evaluative, and themselves subject to disagreement. Davidson's suggestion is obviously that such disagreements will, in the end, be assessable, and that a core of shared values will be reached, but it is not clear that an important amount of indeterminacy will not remain (on these issues, see Lillehammer 2007).

In any case, the form of objectivity which Davidson hopes to show that we reach will not entail any kind of value realism in a robust ontological sense. It will be at best a form of value objectivism, Myers argues, of the kind for which contractualists like Scanlon (2014) have argued. But could he subscribe to "reason fundamentalism" in the sense in which philosophers like Parfit (2011), Scanlon (2014) or Skorupski (2010) have claimed that reasons are primitive, non-psychological and normative attitudes? According to such views, reasons are not combinations of beliefs and desires. They are "considerations" which "favour" certain courses of action or beliefs, and which cannot be analysed further. And most importantly, they are not psychological states. They are facts, either as autonomous entities in the world or true propositions.

For Davidson, reasons cannot be fundamental in this way. Although he uses the term "reasons" in the normative sense, he still considers them as combinations of (normative) beliefs and (normative) desires, in the Humean way. And he subscribes, as we just saw, to a form of internalism and to a practicality requirement, which some reasons fundamentalist accept, but which strong moral realists like Parfit do not. Although he is not a constructivist, Davidson considers reasons to be essentially tied to what is believable and desirable, or with what an agent ideally would believe or desire. And he always considers his objective reasons to be capable of motivating us. If reasons are facts, it is not because the facts are, so to say, out there. It is because we have converged on them through a process of interpretation. So, he is certainly not a moral realist in the strong sense in which this view involves the irreducibility of reasons. And how can he combine his moral realism with his internalism about motivation, since he clearly retains this Humean view?  Myers argues that the position Davidson should have ended up with is Scanlon's version of realism about reasons. He may be right about this, but then Scanlon's realism about reasons is milder than what "fundamentalists" about reasons usually allow.

This book is an excellent piece of work, which shows that Davidson's thinking on interpretation can illuminate a number of issues in contemporary epistemology and ethics. I am less sure that Davidson's approach can give us the basis of a genuine moral realism and a genuine epistemological anti-skepticism. But the greatness of a philosopher lies in the fact that even when one disagrees with him, his thought can still be a starting point for further inquiries. Claudine Verheggen and Robert Myers perform this task remarkably.


Davidson, D. 1980 Essays on Actions and Events, Oxford University Press.

1982 "Rational Animals", Dialectica, in Davidson 2001.

1984 "Expressing Evaluations", in Davidson 2004.

1985 Inquiries Into Truth and Interpretation.

1995 "The Objectivity of Values" in Davidson 2004.

1999 "Reply to Pascal Engel", in Hahn 1999.

2001 Subjective, Objective, Intersubjective, Oxford University Press.

2004 Problems of Rationality, Oxford University Press.

Hahn, L. 1999 The Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Open Court.

Lillehammer, H. 2007 "Davidson on Value and Objectivity", Dialectica, 61, 203-17.

Parfit , D. 2011 On What Matters , vol. 1 and 2, Oxford University Press.

Proust, J. 1999 "Mind, space and objectivity in non-human animals", Erkenntnis, 51, 1, 41-58.

Scanlon, T. 2014 Being Realistic about Reasons, Oxford University Press.

Skorupski, J. 2010 The Domain of Reasons, Oxford University Press.

Stroud, B. 1999 "Radical Interpretation and Philosophical skepticism", in Hahn 1999.

Williamson, T. 2004" Philosophical 'Intuitions' and Scepticism about Judgement",Dialectica Vol. 58, No. 1 (2004), pp. 109-153, reprinted in T. Williamson, The Philosophy of Philosophy, Blackwell, 2009.