Dostoevsky the Thinker

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Scanlan, James P., Dostoevsky the Thinker, Cornell University Press, 2002, 272pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0801439949.

Reviewed by Gary Saul Morson, Northwestern University


Stephen Toulmin has argued that a decisive shift took place in philosophy in the seventeenth century. The religious wars of the time prompted philosophers, from Descartes and Leibniz on, to identify as properly philosophical questions only those that were timeless, theory-based, independent of context, and universal. The idea was that if pure logic, independent of any time or context were once accepted, it would be possible to adjudicate claims without resort to wars and violence. Hence, formal logic was in and rhetoric was out; general principles were in, particular cases were out; abstract axioms were in, concrete diversity was out; the permanent was in, the timely was out. All this ran counter to a tradition from Aristotle to Montaigne, which valued practical wisdom (Aristotle’s phronesis) and saw ethics as a matter of sensitive judgment about particular cases (casuistry in the best sense) rather than deduction from timeless principles. This earlier tradition (think of Montaigne) kept stressing all those cases where life in its complexity overflowed the abstract deductions of a purely theoretical approach. Toulmin argues that the seventeenth-century narrowing of philosophy was a wrong turn taken for admirable reasons, and that it is now time to recover for philosophy the wisdom that was once part of it.1

The wisdom banned as not properly philosophical did not disappear. It found a home in literature, especially in the novel. Daniel Defoe, who is often considered the founder of the modern novel, developed his fiction by lengthening casuistical case studies he wrote for the Athenian Mercury. A dense case, filled with telling and irrelevant details, was invented to invite moral understanding and judgment. Expanded, these became his novels. It might be said that realism, with its attention to detail, to social context, to the devices of self-deceit and self-revelation, holds casuistry as its “form-shaping idea.” When Jane Austen takes as her theme the way in which subtlety of judgment requires both an attentive understanding of fine particulars that make all the difference and a self-doubting appreciation of the ways in which our “pride and prejudice” make us misperceive those particulars, she is producing a marvelous illustration of why theory-based approaches to moral reasoning are bound to fall short. With the Russians – with Tolstoy, for instance – this implicit wisdom of the genre becomes explicit: in both War and Peace and Anna Karenina, a hero develops openly and at length the idea that good moral judgment depends on reasoning up from sensitively perceived particulars in a way that cannot be formalized.

Consider the fundamental plot of the philosophical novel. A hero or heroine becomes convinced of an abstract idea, based on the latest philosophy, and then tries to live it. It is a given in the form that the idea will be shown inadequate in the face of reality’s complexities: this is how realist novels differs from saints’ lives, utopias, or socialist realism, where the exact opposite idea holds. The plot develops by an irony of outcomes – as all the complexities the hero has overlooked defeat him and his idea. And so a hero who believes that love is purely physiological falls in love the way the troubadours imagined (Fathers and Children); or a person who believes that morality is entirely a matter of social convention whose arbitrariness he has recognized finds himself going mad from guilt for a crime he has not even committed but only wished for (The Brothers Karamazov).

Viewed this way, the contribution of great novels to philosophy is inherently skeptical. Someone argues, as economists and political scientists so often do today, that human action can be understood in terms of rational economic man, always pursuing his greatest advantage. There are numerous arguments one can make against this, but there are also a familiar series of counter-arguments. But one may also just ask the person to sit down and read Middlemarch or Anna Karenina and compare their accounts of human behavior with the economic model. The latter will, I think, feel so amazingly thin as to be absurd on the face of it. If it does not, I imagine that there is nothing else that could be said.

Let me offer some examples as to how “novels think” in a way different from, but useful to philosophy. In Middlemarch, several characters reflect on an action taken by Mary Garth while she was attending the dying Mr. Featherstone, a magnate who loved to torture relatives and friends by continually making new wills. Just before he dies, Featherstone asks Mary to destroy his last will so that the next to the last will stand, but she quite properly refuses to do so. It turns out that had she done what Featherstone demanded, her childhood friend Fred would have received 10,000 pounds and could have lived as a gentleman, but now he has nothing. In a quite remarkable discussion, the characters agree on what I imagine a philosopher would regard as a paradox, if not an incoherence: that Mary did the right thing, but that nevertheless it is also right that she feel guilty for doing so. As the Reverend Mr. Farebrother observes, she would not have been so good a person if she did not feel the guilt and regret; although, as he also observes, no one would have the right to make a claim on her because of her action. I think if one were to say: George Eliot believes that we should feel guilty for some of our good actions, the proposition, stated as such, would be criticized as nonsense; and yet when one sees the context, it appears true. Or again, if it does not, there would be no arguments better than cases like this to demonstrate the point.

Dostoevsky, so often considered the greatest psychologist who ever lived, never ceased to show how inadequate our usual ideas of intention are. In Crime and Punishment the paradox would be: it is possible consciously and voluntarily to do something without ever having decided to do so. John Locke famously maintained the common sense view that our actions follow from the last determination of the will. We may revise our intentions, but before we act we must have decided to do so at some point. But Raskolnikov never decides to kill the old woman. He has been fascinated by the possibility of the crime, rehearses for it repeatedly, but lives in a kind of purely hypothetical time. He is always doing just enough so that the possibility remains real, but no more. By a peculiar concatenation of events, holding on to the possibility leads to his committing the murder, albeit in a dream state as if it were another rehearsal. Raskolnikov’s famous inability in the rest of the novel to explain why he killed the old woman – he advances several contradictory ideological explanations, from utilitarianism, to showing he is a superman, to wiping out injustice, to self-testing – derives from the fact that, really, he did not decide to kill her. Ideology and other motives often lead to crime not by provoking a decision but by changing the whole climate of mind. Dostoevsky is filled with passages like this, in which a commonsense or received philosophical theory about action, ethics, or the mind comes to appear impossibly simplistic.

For Dostoevsky, the novel was a kind of extended thought experiment – a way of testing an idea against reality. That may seem peculiar because novelistic events are fictional, so how can such events provide a reality test? The answer is that the constraints of the genre – in this case, of realism – mean that the writer cannot just make any event happen because it validates his theory. If he does, the work will palpably fail – one will sense the actions to be forced, or implausible, or otherwise thin. The most remarkable case of the novel as test is probably Dostoevsky’s The Idiot, which he wrote and published in installments with no idea in advance how the plot would develop. He took a Christ figure and explored what would happen to such a good man when faced with all the perversities of human psychology, which Dostoevsky understood better than anyone. Would not the hero’s very goodness provoke resentment: would people not want to hit him in the mouth just because he turned the other cheek? Would not a true Christian make people worse, rather than better? Dostoevsky clearly hoped that his Christ figure would overcome all these difficulties and that this would be a kind of vindication of the Christian idea, but he was never going to force things in that direction. He really wanted to see whether his hopes would prove valid: and one of the most remarkable things about Dostoevsky is that, in this case, they did not. Christ-like goodness leads to total destruction, of the hero and of others, and winds up doing more harm than good. Dostoevsky found the result disturbing, but let it stand.

In approaching a philosophical novelist, then, a critic may take two approaches to recovering the ideas that may be of wider interest. One may assume that the novel themselves, as both a genre and in particular examples, manifest a kind of wisdom. The work tests ideas, as it tests its heroes and heroines (the test being a common novelistic plot): one measures an idea against the complexity of the world represented. The novel is the great genre of testing, and therefore of skepticism. And a philosophical novelist therefore offers us correctives, qualifications, occasions to re-examine.

But novelists may also offer us positive philosophical doctrines. These may occur in the novels themselves, but also in letters, notebooks, and published essays. At times, these ideas may be remarkably profound, and are neglected by philosophers at their peril. In my view, it is the first approach to the philosophical significance of novels that matters most; but both are important.

James Scanlan’s book, Dostoevsky the Thinker, takes the second approach. He is concerned to extract Dostoevsky’s philosophical ideas about a variety of topics – altruism, aesthetics, immortality, free will, the meaning of suffering, the existence of God, the nature and direction of history and nationality – and to state them in a clear form, where they can be examined and assessed. Where Dostoevsky dramatizes an idea, passing variants of it through the mouths of different characters, Scanlan extracts the core view Dostoevsky held: he wants the doctrine behind the novel. Scanlan is one of the few to construct a coherent overview of Dostoevsky in this way. And unlike his most obvious predecessors, Scanlan is willing to point out fallacies or weak points in the arguments.

Scanlan refutes some received ideas about Dostoevsky quite well. The belief that Dostoevsky was an irrationalist is mistaken if it means that he rejected the need to present evidence for his views. Not only did Dostoevsky repeatedly do so, but also he rejected approaches that did not. His irrationalism is of a quite different sort. He denied psychology could be based on anything like the idea of rational economic man. He saw ethical questions as ones that are enormously impoverished by received forms of rational inquiry. And he found the common forms of rationalism of his time – consequentialism in ethics, determinism, and crude materialism – severely wanting. But none of these considerations make him an irrationalist in terms of what an argument should be. This is a point I have not seen made before, and it needed to be.

One problem facing Scanlan, as it must face others who would write similar books on other philosophical novelists, is that Dostoevsky did not write systematic treatises. Scanlan reconstructs, from the fiction, letters, notebooks, and essays, the more systematic account Dostoevsky might have written:

The primary aim of this book is to do something Dostoevsky himself might have done had he not lacked the opportunity, and perhaps in the end the inclination – namely, present a comprehensive account of his philosophical reflections in the areas to which he turned his attention… . Essentially, I propose to examine the conceptual structure of his philosophical beliefs and try to identify whatever grounding he believed he had for them. Overall, the effort will be to present a portrait of Dostoevsky’s philosophical thought that he himself … might recognize as tolerably faithful to both its letter and its spirit (9-10).

Scanlon refers to this method as “philosophical ghostwriting” (10).

On a number of occasions, this method allows Scanlan to offer useful correctives to interpretations of Dostoevsky. Dostoevsky believed in the “value of suffering,” but there are many different things such a statement can mean, and Scanlan usefully sorts these out. Or in his chapter on Dostoevsky’s aesthetics, he considers Dostoevsky’s arguments against the thesis that art must have a tendency directed at solving a pressing social problem and satisfying basic human needs and so should not contaminate itself with pursuit of the beautiful. Dostoevsky did not argue against this notion by saying, as so many would, that great art cannot accommodate tendentiousness; after all, his own work was highly tendentious and ideological. Rather, he thought that the radicals had a very crude idea of human needs and therefore a poor notion of what tendentious art should look like: so crude were their views, and the art they favored, that for any sensitive person that art, in its sheer shallowness, would refute the very tendencies it was supposed to support. (This is another application of Dostoevsky’s belief that novels can “test” ideas). What is more, beauty is itself a human need.

Most important, Dostoevsky grounds his defense of beauty in the idea of uncertainty. We simply do not know the consequences of our actions and what we advocate; there are countless complexities and unforeseen consequences of unforeseen consequences; the future is radically uncertain. In such a situation, one cultivates not just specific recipes but also sensitivity of thought and feeling, which always has the potential to be useful in ways we cannot foresee. That is why the great art of the past still lives though its treatises on social problems have died, why great art is useful in ways that narrowly tendentious works will never be. This linking of aesthetics to uncertainty is a quite powerful and novel idea, and Scanlon brings it out admirably.

Over the course of several chapters, this book traces Dostoevsky’s views about the essence of human nature. There have been those who, like Rousseau and most anarchists, see human nature as fundamentally good, and evil as superficial. By contrast, Freud saw all professions of good as simply a mask for fundamentally asocial drives, which are always real and irreducible. Ivan Karamazov is perhaps the most powerful spokesman for the latter camp, a great philosopher of what Alicia Chudo has called “misanthropology,”2 and when he asks whether cruelty is a matter of mere bad qualities or is inherent in human nature, he soon answers that it is the latter. With all the complexity of his psychology, Dostoevsky demonstrated over and over again that both impulses go all the way down and that neither reductionist view can account for what we see in human beings. Good masks evil – and vice versa. Scanlan develops this idea in terms Dostoevsky sometimes used: “the law of love” and the egoistic “law of personality.”

Dostoevsky was not a systematic reasoner and he advanced many of his views as polemical responses to particular opponents. Scanlan suggests that the dialogical nature of his novels was “a natural complement to his dialectical approach to the problems of philosophy” (231). Mikhail Bakhtin argued something rather different, that Dostoevsky saw everything – language, personality, and culture, truth itself – as inherently dialogic, and so he developed both dialogical forms of fiction and dialogical forms of journalism.3 Scanlan’s essential method is to ghostwrite, to tidy up, to find the system and proposition behind a dialogue. He does an excellent job. But I cannot help thinking that Dostoevsky’s real greatness – as a philosopher, not just as an artist – cannot be reached solely in this way. One must also read the novels in all their dialogical complexity as novels to appreciate his deepest thought. And this is true not only of Dostoevsky, but also of all the great philosophical novelists.


1. Stephen Toulmin, Cosmopolis: The Hidden Agenda of Modernity (New York: Free Press, 1990), pp. 7-44.

2. Alicia Chudo, And Quiet Flows the Vodka, or When Pushkin Comes to Shove: The curmudgeon’s Guide to Russian Literature and Culture (Evanston: Northwestern UP, 2000).

3. Mikhail Bakhtin, Problems of Dostoevsky’s Poetics, ed. and trans. Caryl Emerson (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).