Double-Effect Reasoning: Doing Good and Avoiding Evil

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T. A. Cavanaugh, Double-Effect Reasoning: Doing Good and Avoiding Evil, Oxford University Press, 2006, 220pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199272190.

Reviewed by Neil Delaney, Georgetown University


T.A. Cavanaugh's book presents itself as the first sustained monograph on the principle of double effect (henceforth PDE) and what the author terms "double effect reasoning" (henceforth DER), and to the best of this writer's knowledge the book stands as advertised. The monograph is neatly divided into five chapters. The first outlines the history of DER, and follows many (with the notable exception of Jonathan Bennett) by tracing the origin of DER back to St. Thomas Aquinas. The second chapter brings us up to date on matters pertaining to PDE, and includes a lengthy discussion of the infamous "proportionality clause" that seems to take us away from the notion that PDE is a wholly anti-consequentialist principle. Chapters 3 and 4 bring us to the heart of the matter, 3 being a careful analysis of the intention/foresight distinction, including the so-called problem of "closeness," and 4 being a treatment of the ethical import of the intention/foresight distinction presuming we have made some sense of it as a distinction in 3. The book rounds out the treatment of DER with an array of further issues for study, including DER and public policy with respect to euthanasia, DER, noncombatant casualties and the rules of (just) warfare, DER in the law more generally and lastly DER and Roman Catholic moral theology. All in all the book is a relatively comprehensive and interesting study of a principle and style of reasoning central to modern casuistry. Having provided the reader with a basic overview of the project I will now proceed to examine the first four chapters in some greater depth.

The first chapter provides an excellent historical introduction to DER, beginning with St. Thomas and culminating with the work of the Jesuit theologian Jean-Pierre Gury. The treatment essentially begins with Aquinas' discussion of the case of homicidal self-defense; Aquinas argues that such self-defense is permissible provided the homicidal force is the least necessary to subdue the attacker and that the death of the attacker is not intended, but rather is merely foreseen. Taking this resolution of a hard case involving an exceptionless moral norm (a private individual may not intend to take the life of an assailant) as a springboard, Cavanaugh traces developments of this style of reasoning through an array of 14th through 17th century writers up until the formulation of PDE offered by Gury, which is essentially as follows (p.26): an act producing both good and evil will be permissible provided that (1) the act in itself is good or indifferent, (2) the agent intends the good effect and not the evil effect, (3) the good effect is not produced by the evil effect, (4) there is a proportionately grave reason for producing the evil effect. Having brought us this far along in the conversation Cavanaugh concludes the chapter with some efforts at simplifying the set of individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for permissibly acting so as to produce both good and evil. The simplification is as follows (p.36): the act is permissible so long as (1) the act considered independently of its evil effect is not itself wrong, (2) the agent intends the good and does not intend the evil either as an end or a means, (3) the agent has proportionately grave reasons for acting, addressing his relevant obligations, comparing the consequences and, considering the necessity of the evil, exercising due care to eliminate it or mitigate it. With this formulation in hand we move to Chapter 2, which Cavanaugh titles "The Contemporary Conversation".

In Chapter 2 Cavanaugh first takes up proportionalism, then turns to the work of some contemporary thinkers, notably Alan Donagan, Frances Kamm, Warren Quinn, and the trio of John Finnis, Germain Grisez and Joseph Boyle. His discussion of proportionalism, that is, the inclusion of the so-called "proportionality clause," involves a rejection of it grounded in the rather obvious and well-noted fact that the clause renders PDE a consequentialist principle, or at least some sort of hybrid between anti-consequentialism and consequentialism. I will not dwell on this discussion here. Cavanaugh then turns to the work of the aforementioned thinkers and finds apparent weaknesses in each of their own anticonsequentialist alternatives to DER and PDE that they find more appealing. We do well to note at this juncture that Cavanaugh is almost exclusively concerned with three hard cases from the contemporary literature: (1) the distinction between therapeutic hysterectomies and craniotomies, (2) the distinction between terminal sedation and active euthanasia, (3) the distinction between tactical bombing and terror bombing. Much of his criticism of other writers has to do with the ways in which their anticonsequentialist alternatives to DER and PDE decide one or more of these cases wrongly. Presumably the "right" way to resolve each is as follows, employing DER and specifically PDE: there is a moral difference between therapeutic hysterectomy and craniotomy, the former being permissible and the latter always impermissible; there is a moral difference between terminal sedation and active euthanasia, the former being permissible and the latter always impermissible; there is a moral difference between tactical bombing and terror bombing, the former under specified conditions being permissible and the latter always impermissible. In Cavanaugh's opinion Donagan's account in terms of material and formal guilt (basically the distinction between posing a threat and intending to pose a threat while doing so) renders craniotomy acceptable, and cannot explain the seeming permissibility of tactical bombing. Next Cavanaugh turns to Frances Kamm's alternative to DER and PDE, the principle of permissible harm (PPH). The basic idea of PPH turns out to be that it is permissible for greater good itself to cause lesser harm. She complements the PPH with another principle, PSP, that states that when PPH justifies some lesser harm and one can minimize that harm by an act that would otherwise be impermissible, one may so act. (p.54) The first example Cavanaugh gives of these principles working in tandem is the following: if PPH allows one to tactically bomb thereby killing some civilians, then PSP states that if you can kill fewer civilians by terror bombing them you may do so. Without delving too deeply into these matters suffice it say that Cavanaugh thinks that Kamm's ruling of permissibility for terror bombing in such a case is mistaken, and thus that her alternative principles must be rejected. Cavanaugh then turns to contemporary versions of DER represented in the writings of Quinn, and the trio of Finnis, Grisez and Boyle. Quinn's version revolves around the notions of direct and indirect harmful agency, the former being the case in which "harm comes to some victims, at least in part, from the agent's deliberately involving them in something in order to further his purpose precisely by way of their being so involved", the latter being the case in which "either nothing is in that way intended for the victims or what is so intended does not contribute to their harm." (quoted from Quinn at Cavanaugh p.63) According to Cavanaugh, while Quinn's new notions get hysterectomy/craniotomy and tactical/terror bombing right, they lead to a DER analysis of terminal sedation/euthanasia that treats the two alike. Cavanaugh makes the by now rather commonplace observation that Quinn's new formulation of PDE places emphasis not so much on the intentions of the actor in acting upon the victim the way that PDE traditionally did, but rather on the rights of the victim not to be used in the actor's plans. (p.66) So if nothing else the spirit of PDE has been compromised. So much for Quinn. Finally we turn to the trio of Finnis, Grisez and Boyle. In assessing their accounts we focus on the hysterectomy/craniotomy distinction, which it will be recalled is "supposed" to issue in invariably bad evaluations of craniotomy. The trio finds a need to pay very close attention to what the doctor really must intend in performing the craniotomy, and, like H.L.A. Hart many years before, it seems to them that properly understood the agent need not intend the death of the fetus at all, really rather a head modification. They introduce in place of a loose ordinary language the language of conceptual necessity, and distinguish between "assassination," for example, which conceptually involves (intentional) killing and "decapitation," which does not (although there is a causally necessary connection between decapitation and death). Cavanaugh rightly notes that cases in which one intends to kill either as an end or a means are thus going to be few and far between (for example, it seems to this writer that Hamlet's plan to send Claudius' unshriven soul to hell involved killing Claudius as a means). In any case Cavanaugh concludes that the language of conceptual necessity is too narrow for the purposes of employing DER to generate evaluations of actions, and rejects Finnis, Grisez and Boyle as well. This leads straightaway into Chapters 3 and 4, where Cavanaugh develops his own account of the intention/foresight distinction and attempts to demonstrate its ethical significance. This strikes me as the core of the monograph.

We have seen how the intention/foresight distinction plays a critical role in DER and PDE specifically. A basic way of understanding PDE is to take it as saying that it sometimes makes a moral difference whether one produces evil as a means to a good end or as an end in itself in conjunction with the furtherance of a good end, which is to say one intends the evil, or rather merely foresees that the evil will come about as a result of one's neutral or better endeavorings. So, to stick with one of Cavanaugh's favorite examples: many think that there is a moral difference between crushing the skull of the fetus so as to save the mother's life versus removing the fetus in the course of removing the cancerous uterus, again with the ultimate aim of saving the mother. People think this because in the first case they think that the doctor is simply killing an innocent as a means to saving the life of another, whereas in the second the doctor is simply removing a cancerous uterus with the foreseen but unintended side effect of producing the death of an innocent (the fetus). The Roman Catholic Church has certainly traditionally thought this is a difference that makes a moral difference, and so does Cavanaugh. Now, we see the foreshadowing of the problem with grounding evaluations of actions on the intended/foreseen distinction in our rather quick discussion of Finnis, Grisez and Boyle. Hart may have put it best some time ago: what if the doctor performing the craniotomy insists that he has no intention to kill the fetus at all, rather merely an intention to modify its cranial structure with the foreseen but unintended side effect of bringing about the death of the fetus? This way of describing matters, which strikes many as sophistic, is precisely what led Philippa Foot to introduce the case of the trapped spelunkers, who insist that they only intend to rearrange the molecules of the party member trapped in the only exit, rather than intending to kill him (by blowing him to smithereens, or maybe better, not by blowing him to smithereens, but by accomplishing this at one and the same time as clearing the means of egress). Surely, she argued, to say you intend to rearrange the molecules of the man without intending to kill him but merely foreseeing this as a side effect is crazy. So we introduce the famous problem of "closeness," as it crops up for anyone who tries to make the intended/foreseen distinction a load-bearing part of a morally evaluative system. Cavanaugh properly notes this; indeed, to make perspicuous the line at which two or more effects are deemed too "close" is a good part of what it takes to make useful sense of intended/foreseen. His basic strategy is to try to develop a theory of intention in relatively short order (borrowing significantly from Michael Bratman's planning theory of intention) that will illuminate the distinctions in question. Basically Cavanaugh tries to solve the crucial problem of closeness by taking into account what guides the doctor in carrying out his objective. So, he thinks that the doctor is guided to crush the skull of the fetus so as to save the mother's life in craniotomy, whereas the doctor is in no way guided by the death of the fetus in hysterectomy. Of course this really accomplishes nothing; Hart et al will continue to insist that what the doctor in craniotomy is guided by is head modification, not killing at all, just as the doctor in hysterectomy is guided by removal of the uterus, not killing the fetus. To suggest that being guided in one's choice of surgical instruments by which are most likely to effectively crush the skull of the fetus is to be guided by evil, as Nagel might say, more specifically to be guided by what will promptly kill the fetus, is wholly question begging. The problem of closeness, I am afraid, rests right where it did before Cavanaugh attacked it with the planning theory of intention. It seems fair to this reader that to demonstrate that Cavanaugh's own theory of DER fails to generate the right conclusion in a crucial test case sufficiently undermines his objective of providing us with a better framework than his prior targets in Chapter 2.

Finally for purposes of this review we turn to Chapter 4, which discusses and argues for the ethical significance of DER and PDE (for once and for all this writer wants to make it clear that DER and PDE are, once we emerge into the light of the contemporary discussion, the same; to engage in double effect reasoning is to endorse and evaluate actions according to some formulation of PDE). Cavanaugh makes a rather commonplace distinction between first order and second order morality; first order morality refers to the evaluation of acts, second order to the evaluation of agents. It has been argued most prominently in the contemporary literature by J.J. Thomson that PDE is straightforwardly absurd, in that it endeavors to evaluate actions based on the intentions of the agent, whereas it is manifestly obvious that a bad actor can perform morally permissible actions. For example: suppose we have a bomber who aims at a military installation while foreseeing that he will kill a (properly proportional) number of noncombatants. And say he enjoys the killing of noncombatants, because he is a sadist (we will call him STB, or sadistic tactical bomber). Now: it is asked, may he perform the bombing run with these entrenched attitudes, or must we find another pilot who does not enjoy killing civilians? Thomson clearly thinks it is morally permissible for STB to perform the run regardless of his attitudes towards the noncombatants. The bombing run is the key, she thinks; it is by nature tactical, so under specified conditions permissible. What attitude the agent takes regarding the matter, whether it be regret, ennui or joy, is applicable only to our evaluation of him as an actor, not the moral permissibility of his action. Similarly, I should suppose, a doctor who enjoys inflicting pain while performing legitimate surgeries. It is permissible for him or any other doctor to perform the surgeries; the sadistic doctor is simply a bastard. Now all this strikes me and Cavanaugh as a bit too quick, I take it. For we are talking about the ethical relevance of the intention/foresight distinction and specifically whether having bad intentions can lead to a negative evaluation of the agent's action plan. So far what we have seen in the Thomson-style cases is a bad attitude towards noncombatant death or patient suffering. We have not seen a bad intention on the part of the actor. Once you toss in an intention to inflict pain or death on patients or noncombatants, any sensible theory of intention and rational planning (including Cavanaugh's) will have the agent committed to courses of conduct that seem unacceptable. For instance, if we get beyond the STB's joy at killing noncombatants and move all the way to assigning him an intention to kill them so as to ensure this joy, he looks like he will be behaving impermissibly. For example, he will most likely be trying to double back and hit the noncombatants if they somehow escape the blast on the military target. Heck, that's where all the fun is. So all in all it does seem to me that token intentions on the part of particular actors make a difference in how we evaluate not merely them as agents but what they do. Here I take it I am in agreement with Cavanaugh.

I conclude with the thought that, as this review suggests, all the real action of this monograph is in Chapters 3 and 4. The book should prove useful to general ethicians. I do not think it will prove especially useful to serious action theorists. It is not written with the sophistication of, say, Frances Kamm's ­Intricate Ethics, but I do not believe it was intended for quite that crowd. Rather, it is a well put-together general overview of the PDE as it has developed from the Middle Ages into contemporary casuistry, and will be quite suitable for advanced undergraduate courses in ethical theory.