Doubt, Ethics and Religion: Wittgenstein and the Counter-Enlightenment

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Luigi Perissinotto and Vicente Sanfélix (eds.), Doubt, Ethics and Religion: Wittgenstein and the Counter-Enlightenment, Ontos, 2010, 178pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381023.

Reviewed by Brian R. Clack, University of San Diego


This is a collection of eight papers exploring Wittgenstein's work in relation to some crucial thinkers who (the editors tell us) were key to the counter-enlightenment. In their introduction, the editors contend that Wittgenstein is best seen not simply as one more philosopher in the analytic tradition but as "an extremely original thinker, highly personal in his philosophical and writing styles", and that one of his overarching concerns is his "(quite pessimistic) diagnosis … of the western civilization" (p. 7). Whether the papers collected in this volume actually do address these issues well enough is arguable, but some significant lines of enquiry are nonetheless opened up.

The majority of the contributions relate to Wittgenstein's thought on religious belief: both Jean-Pierre Cometti and Isabel Cabrera address the question of the religious character of Wittgenstein's thinking (Cometti focusing on the connections between Wittgenstein and the pragmatist tradition in philosophy), Joaquín Jareño Alarcón considers Wittgenstein's attitude to the question concerning the existence of God (and the evidence typically marshaled to argue for it), Vicente Sanfélix compares Wittgenstein's thought on religion with that of Hume, and Joan Llinares undertakes a comparison of Wittgenstein with Tolstoy and Nietzsche. Concerning matters beyond the purely religious, Luigi Perissinotto addresses the question of doubt in On Certainty, highlighting how Wittgenstein's approach to epistemology stands in marked contrast to the thought of Kant and Descartes (among others). Lastly, two (deeply interesting) papers consider connections between Wittgenstein and Schopenhauer: Julián Marrades Millet reflects upon the influence of Schopenhauer on Wittgenstein's early thought, while Chon Tejedor challenges (successfully, it would seem) a prevalent Schopenhauerian reading of the ethical content of the Tractatus.

It is good to see close attention being paid to Wittgenstein's relation to broader cultural matters, though one might reasonably feel that this collection misses the opportunity really to probe some of the most salient issues. Consider, first of all, the account generally provided here of Wittgenstein's view of religious belief. Too frequently, the contributors fall back on the outdated idea that Wittgenstein believes religion constitutes a distinct language-game. Alarcón, for example, writes:

There is no logical derivation to undoubtedly demonstrate God's existence. This is the condition of the use of the religious language game as we know it. This is how we play the game. The existence of God is assumed as a special certainty of the language game in which it is being used. (pp. 49-50)

This way of presenting things seems outmoded now, since one generally accepted result of the many critical discussions concerning Wittgenstein's view of religion is that he didn't think of religion as a language-game at all. He certainly never explicitly characterizes religious belief in those terms, and the examples he does provide of language-games are of much smaller phenomena (giving orders, reporting an event, acting in a play, telling a joke, etc.). Considering religion in these terms, moreover, would seem to open up Wittgenstein's view to the tired charge of fideism, and this is something, again, which current discussions seem to have left behind. The true application to religion of Wittgenstein's thoughts concerning language-games is simply that language is always embedded in an activity of some kind, and that the meaning of religious expressions can only be understood by attention to religious practice: "Practice gives the words their sense", Wittgenstein famously writes.

The criticism to be made here, therefore, is that some contributors to this volume fall back too readily on simplistic interpretations of Wittgenstein's view of religion. Something similar is true of the contributors' explication of that most vital of Wittgenstein's writings on religion: the Remarks on Frazer's Golden Bough. The view taken of this text by a number of contributors to Doubt, Ethics and Religion is a familiar (yet nonetheless erroneous) one, namely that Wittgenstein advances an expressivist understanding of religious belief and ritual. Cabrera, for example, writes that (for Wittgenstein) religious statements "express and evoke attitudes and feelings" (p. 130); the function of religious language is:

to express attitudes, to motivate practices, to reflect vital commitments. Anyone who interprets religion as a theory is making a serious error, because seen through scientific eyes, religion is an erroneous and even an irrational conception … For Wittgenstein, it is in this that Frazer's great insensitivity lies. (p. 131)

This is not an isolated interpretation, for Sanfélix also voices such a view: "religious beliefs do not come into contradiction with each other and this is due to their expressive nature, their quality of symbolic crystallization, of allegorical manifestation of certain experiences" (p. 35).

Notwithstanding its ubiquity in discussions of Wittgenstein, the problem with such an interpretation is simply that it is false. To depict Wittgenstein as an expressivist runs counter to the overall aims of his later philosophy, while the picture of belief and ritual emerging from the Remarks on Frazer is not straightforwardly expressivist at all. A word should be said about both of these points. Firstly, to say that Wittgenstein thinks religious statements do not state facts but rather express attitudes makes him sound too much like a logical positivist. The positivists, remember, had stripped religious utterance of any cognitive status, but had provided one route of escape for religion: consistent with the merely emotive meaning of moral terms, religious statements might have some kind of emotive, poetic, or expressive status. R. B. Braithwaite famously adopted an approach of this character, of course. In Wittgenstein's later philosophy, however, such neat distinctions as "descriptive"/"non-descriptive", "cognitive"/"non-cognitive", and "factual"/ "expressive" are unhelpful, for there is no clear-cut sense of the descriptive from which the expressive can be distinguished. After all, description, he said, may denote "a great variety of thing" (Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, volume 1, §981).

When one turns to the Remarks on Frazer, moreover, one encounters something other than an expressivist theory of religion. True, there appear to be comments which suggest that rituals have a fundamentally expressive character (burning in effigy is akin to kissing the picture of a loved one; rain dances are a celebration of the coming of the rainy season; etc.), but the overall picture is rather mixed, Wittgenstein at times appearing to endorse both an instrumental conception of ritual and a non-expressive view of religious belief. Hence:

Eating and drinking have their dangers, not only for savages but also for us; nothing more natural than wanting to protect oneself against these. (Remarks on Frazer's Golden Bough).

People at one time thought it useful to kill a man, sacrifice him to the god of fertility, in order to produce good crops. (Lectures: Cambridge 1932-1935)

In the face of such a mixed picture, it may be well to avoid drawing a conclusion about any positive theory of religious belief arising from the Remarks on Frazer, and instead to see Wittgenstein's words as functioning in a largely negative light: in other words, as a criticism of (certain aspects) of Frazer's theory of ritual. And one of the things that Wittgenstein seems to be most critical of in this context is relevant to the theme of a collection of papers purporting to be concerned with Wittgenstein's "pessimistic diagnosis of western civilization".

What Wittgenstein (at least in part) seems to discern in Frazer is a figure fully representative of the modern age, intent upon understanding everything in terms of the dominant fad of our culture: scientific progress. For Frazer, magic and religion are primitive (and mistaken) attempts at scientific thought, and they become redundant as the forward march of historical progress brings about scientific liberation from ignorance. Wittgenstein rejects both the view that magic is (as Frazer called it) "the bastard sister of science" and the contention of The Golden Bough that history presents us with the story of the social and intellectual progressive improvement of humanity. And the great influence lying behind Wittgenstein's rejection of the progressive view of history was Oswald Spengler, author of The Decline of the West. In contradistinction to a conception of history as linear and advancing, Spengler saw instead history as the drama of a number of mighty cultures, each of which arises, ripens, decays, and dies. Western culture, for Spengler (and for Wittgenstein), has reached the stage of decline and has wilted into materialism and triviality. A great deal of Wittgenstein's thought -- from his account of the nature of religion to his elaboration of an appropriate philosophical method -- can be understood from this Spenglerian perspective (see my An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Religion and William James DeAngelis' Wittgenstein: A Cultural Point of View for two attempts to do precisely this).

In conclusion, then, it is laudable for a book such as Doubt, Ethics and Religion to seek to place Wittgenstein in the broader context of western culture (and not merely to see him as an analytic philosopher struggling with the abstract problems of philosophy), but for this to be done really effectively a lot more attention should have been given to what is tantalizingly hinted at in the editors' introduction: Wittgenstein's cultural pessimism. This can truly be explored only by reference to the influence of Spengler on Wittgenstein, and yet not one reference to Spengler is to be found within this book. This is a pity, though there may well be enough interesting pieces in this collection to make it a worthwhile read nonetheless.