Doubt Truth to Be a Liar

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Graham Priest, Doubt Truth to Be a Liar, Oxford University Press, 2006, 240pp, $65.00, ISBN 0199263280

Reviewed by Hartry Field, New York University


This wide-ranging book is divided into four Parts: Truth, Negation, Rationality and Logic. Priest's discussion of these topics is centered around their bearing on his doctrine of dialetheism, the view that some contradictions are true; but the discussions are of great interest independent of dialetheism. The quality of the discussion is generally very high, and the book is a must-read for anyone interested in the central questions of the philosophy of logic. I do however have complaints, and will tend to focus on them in this review.

The book begins with a discussion of the "Law of Non-Contradiction"; Priest announces his opposition to this Law on the opening page of the first chapter. Unfortunately, he never states the version of the law that he is attacking. The Law is implicitly formulated in the opening chapter, and explicitly formulated on p. 78, as

(LNC) □ ¬[α ¬α].

But after the explicit formulation, he notes (pp. 78-9) that the Law in this form is one he himself is committed to: for given two laws he accepts (the deMorgan laws and double-negation elimination), LNC is equivalent to the Law of Excluded Middle in necessitated form

(LEM) □ [α ∨ ¬α];

and he also accepts LEM. So the target of Priest's attack can't be LNC; but then, what is it? Were it not for n. 7 on p. 78, I would have said that what he is attacking is the injunction against accepting contradictions (sentences of form α ¬α). However, in that footnote he argues that that injunction is not a satisfactory formulation of the Law of Non-Contradiction either, though he offers nothing better. Still, the injunction against accepting contradictions is clearly part of his real target, whereas LNC is not really targeted at all. Priest's unclarity about whether the "Law of Non-Contradiction" means LNC or something that a dialetheist should be opposed to plays an important role in some of his arguments, as we'll see; and later in the book (e.g. p. 120) he returns to writing as if it is LNC to which he is opposed.

Of course his view is not that all contradictions should be acceptable, only some of them. To accept some but not all, it is required that one adopt a paraconsistent logic in which contradictions don't imply everything, in contrast to classical logic; and Priest does so.

It's worth noting that a distinction could be made between accepting the truth of a contradiction and accepting that contradiction; Priest defines dialetheism in terms of the former, but takes it to involve the latter as well. Of course anyone who accepts the former is committed to the latter if he accepts the elimination rule for 'True', True(<α>)├ α, as most people (including Priest and myself) do. Still, there are possible responses to the Liar Paradox that involve restricting the rule, and so allowing dialetheism in the defined sense without the acceptance of contradictions (and in a purely classical logic). Priest's blurring of this possibility could engender confusion.[1]

The first of the three chapters in Part I (Truth) is on Aristotle's critique of the "Law of Non-Contradiction". The second argues convincingly against the idea that one can use a theory of truth to argue against dialetheism. In addition, Priest argues that the deflationist view of truth tends to favour dialetheism. How? Priest plausibly identifies the "prime thought" of deflationism as the view that 'α' and '<α> is true' amount to the same thing; presumably this means that they should be everywhere intersubstitutable (except in opaque contexts). Given a biconditional '↔' with the minimal law 'α ↔ α', this entails all instances of the Tarski schema

True(<α>) ↔ α.

Priest notes that the application of this schema to a Liar sentence β immediately leads (assuming Modus Ponens)[2] to the biconditional True(<β>) ↔ ¬True(<β>), which in classical logic is unacceptable since (i) it implies True(<β>) ¬True(<β>), and (ii) this in turn implies everything. Priest favors blocking the triviality argument only at stage (ii). He mentions that there are ways of blocking step (i) of the argument; but they rely on weakening the Law of Excluded Middle (and also the intuitionist reductio rule), and Priest will defend Excluded Middle in a later chapter. (He also cites other work of his that criticizes solutions that keep the truth schema by weakening LEM instead of going dialetheic.) So he takes the deflationist theory as providing positive support for the acceptance of contradictions and dialetheism.[3]

While I think Priest gives short shrift to non-dialetheic theories that save the truth schema (and the intersubstitutivity of 'True(<α>)' with 'α') by restricting excluded middle, I will not discuss this. It's worth mentioning, though, that Priest's own favored version of dialetheism, though it vindicates the truth schema, fails to vindicate intersubstitutivity: in particular, '¬α' fails to entail '¬True(<α>)' (though the converse implication holds). Since as he says the "prime thought" of deflationist theories of truth is intersubstitutivity, this means that these theories contradict Priest's form of dialetheism rather than supporting it.

The final chapter in Part I concerns trivialism, officially defined as the view that everything is true; since the elimination rule for 'true' is assumed, the trivialist in question accepts everything. Priest has an interesting discussion of why it is irrational to be a trivialist, given that no argument against the trivialist can have suasive force. (Since the trivialist accepts everything, any argument one offers will only reinforce something he already accepts.) In the course of the chapter Priest argues that a sensible dialetheist should reject any contradiction α ¬α for which α is an observation sentence: for if α is an observation sentence, then if α ¬α were true we should be able to observe that it's true, and we don't. (And presumably it isn't that we both do and don't observe this: we are in a position to reject the claim that we ever observe the truth of a contradiction, i.e. to rule out accepting that claim.)[4]

Turning to Part II (Negation), Chapter 4 argues that the normal understanding of negation requires the Law of Excluded Middle but allows for the acceptance of contradictions. To this end, Priest defines the negation of α to be the contradictory of α,[5] and takes the traditional characterization of contradictoriness to be by the Laws of Excluded Middle and Non-Contradiction, as given by LEM and LNC above. This is where, for the first time, Priest notes that the dialetheist may well accept LNC: indeed, that in deMorgan logics it is equivalent to LEM, so that Priest himself accepts it. So whatever form of the Law of Non-Contradiction it is that Priest has been arguing against in earlier chapters is never built into the traditional characterization of contradictoriness! This is the key to what is perhaps Priest's main argument in the chapter (p. 85), that anyone who gives up LEM must abandon the traditional explanation of contradictoriness, while the dialetheist need not. However, even on this interpretation of the Law of Non-Contradiction as LNC, the dialetheist has to reject this explanation of contradictoriness, though for a different reason: any strengthening of the negation operator that obeys deMorgan and double-negation elimination must also satisfy LEM and LNC, so the "traditional explanation" (as Priest understands it) fails to distinguish negation from the strengthening. (For instance, the operator O for which Oα is true whatever the truth-value of α satisfies these laws.) Of course a genuine law of non-contradiction, the sort that Priest was talking about in earlier chapters, would rule out such a strengthening of negation; but it would rule out negation too (according to the dialetheist), so if it were part of the traditional characterization then the dialetheist would still have to reject the traditional characterization.

The discussion of LEM is marred by the false suggestion (p. 79) that giving up LEM requires endorsing truth-value gaps. (Priest explicitly makes this claim only in the case of intuitionism, and even there admits that intuitionists might not agree that they endorse truth-value gaps; but the implicit claim seems more general.) To anyone who accepts the intersubstitutivity properties of truth and identifies falsehood with truth of negation, the claim that α is neither true nor false is equivalent to ¬α ¬¬α, and hence must be rejected if the person isn't a dialetheist. A related false suggestion (also on 79) is that without LEM one can't hold that not-α is true if and only if α is not true, or that not-α is true if and only if α is either false or neither true nor false. (Clearly one must hold these if one takes 'true' to obey intersubstitutivity and takes falsity to be truth of negation.) On the basis of this second suggestion, Priest argues that without LEM one can't regard negation as a genuine contradictory-forming operator. However, he then seems to withdraw the second suggestion, leaving him without a positive argument for LEM; instead, he gives a critique of intuitionist arguments against excluded middle. But the mistaken suggestion that to give up LEM is to endorse truth-value gaps recurs at key points later on, and important arguments turn on it (e.g., pp. 90, 106).

Chapter 5 argues against various attempts to show that a negation operator obeying the classical laws must be coherent; also, against attempts to show that a conditional obeying at least the intuitionist laws must be coherent. I recommend the discussion (though in places it is unduly biased against views of negation that restrict Excluded Middle).

Chapter 6 begins with a good discussion of why rejection must be distinguished from acceptance of the negation. (In dialetheic views with excluded middle, the latter is necessary but not sufficient for the former; in non-dialetheic views without excluded middle, it's the other way around.) The discussion seems to assume that claims about what we accept and reject are not themselves dialetheic, e.g. that it is impossible to reject p while also not rejecting it; the rationale for this would have been worth discussing. (If the claim that someone accepts or rejects p counts as observational, we can apparently get this from the thesis that observational claims are never dialetheic, though there are subtleties lurking.) The chapter also argues, somewhat independently of dialetheism, that there are situations where one has contradictory obligations; Priest argues that in Newcomb's problem one ought to take only one box and also ought to take two, and that one both ought to believe and ought not to believe a sentence γ that asserts that it is irrational to believe γ. (Not that one ought to both take the second box and not take it, or believe γ and not to believe γ; he takes these to be impossible.) Of course, knowing that one's obligations are contradictory is of little help in deciding whether to take the second box, or to believe γ.

Turning to Part III (Rationality), Chapter 7 contains a nice discussion of why it would be irrational to dismiss dialetheism out of hand, and of how accepting dialetheism leaves the possibility of rational debate unharmed. It concludes with a favorable evaluation of dialetheic treatments of the truth-theoretic paradoxes over non-dialetheic accounts that abandon the Tarski truth schema. (The main text suggests that only dialetheic accounts can vindicate the truth schema, though this is partially corrected in a footnote.) Chapter 8 deals with the question of how to deal with inconsistent sets of beliefs in formal accounts of belief revision (like AGM); this of course is important quite independently of dialetheism. Chapter 9 deals with the epistemological implications of inconsistencies within empirical science, indeed within particular theories; a nice account of this (involving "chunking") was given in Brown and Priest (2004), and it is mentioned here (though perhaps with insufficient detail). Priest also argues that if an inconsistent scientific theory entails inconsistencies at the observational level, or if it avoids observational inconsistencies only by "chunking", then the theory can be accepted only provisionally. On the other hand, he argues that if a theory is inconsistent but the inconsistency is more naturally prevented from spreading to the observational level, there is no obvious bar to accepting it as an ultimate theory. (He suggests examples where the theoretical inconsistency is in the mathematical part of the theory, but clearly intends to allow for examples in which it resides elsewhere.)

Part IV (Logic) begins with a defense of the revisability of logic, or at least, of our theories of logic. (Priest suggests that a "revision of logic" is nothing more than a revision in our theory of logic; this strikes me as questionable, though the issue is complicated.) In discussing Quine, he points out that even if the logical constants are assumed to vary in meaning between classical logic and a rival, e.g., a paraconsistent logic, this does not rule out the possibility of rationally revising the logic by rejecting connectives with "the classical meanings" in favor of those with "the paraconsistent meanings". He suggests (p. 171) that one who proposes to rationally revise logic in this way must be committed to the idea that the meanings he favors are the same as the vernacular meanings of the terms. This seems unduly conservative: why can't the vernacular meanings be criticized as laden with a bad theory? I don't see why someone who wants to reject classical logic in favor of a weaker one, say to deal with the truth paradoxes, need be committed to the view that the weaker logic accords better with the vernacular meanings than does classical logic.

Chapter 11 concerns validity. One issue I wish he had discussed is whether one can be dialetheic about validity claims: can some inferences be both valid and invalid, and if not why not? But let's confine attention to what he does discuss. A main claim of the chapter is that deductive validity, which corresponds with how we ought to reason, is the relationship of truth-preservation-in-all-situations. I don't think this is defensible given the kind of logic he accepts. For he regards Modus Ponens as a rule by which we should reason. But to accept that it is truth-preserving would be to accept that for any sentences α and β

(TP) True(<α>) True(<α→β>) → True(<β>).

And that would lead to triviality in Priest's logic: if β is (e.g.) 'The earth is flat', and α is a Curry sentence that says that if it itself is true then the earth is flat, then the corresponding instance of (TP) is itself equivalent to that Curry sentence in Priest's logic; so accepting that instance of (TP) would imply that the earth is flat.

Perhaps Priest could defend himself against this example by arguing that there is no "situation" in which the Curry sentence α (and its equivalent α → the earth is flat) is true? Maybe, though he does suggest that situations might include impossible situations. But the move will not in the end help: he certainly believes that the "situations" include an actual situation; and it turns out that peculiarities in his logic commit him to the view that there are acceptable deductive inferences that don't preserve truth even in the actual situation! More fully, there are γ and δ such that Priest accepts γ and accepts the inference from γ to δ, but regards the conditional True(<γ>) → True(<δ>) as "solely false", i.e. false and not true: he is committed to rejecting that conditional even though he accepts the inference and believes its antecedent (and its consequent).[6] For details, see section 12 of Field forthcoming. (By contrast, in logics that restrict excluded middle to save the truth schema, it is recognized that rules like Modus Ponens do not preserve truth in all impossible situations, but there is no bar to holding that they preserve truth in all possible situations including the actual one.)

The book concludes with a chapter on logical pluralism (the view that there is a multiplicity of logics that are equally correct). Priest argues that there is no interesting sense of pluralism that is correct. Part of the argument is that supposed alternative logics typically give accounts of what preserves truth in a restricted class of situations, but there can be only one logic that preserves truth in all situations, and this is distinguished as the genuine logic. It would have been worth considering the worry that the notion of "all situations" is too indeterminate for this to succeed in picking out a unique logic.

In the case of a book so filled with interesting discussion of important topics, any reviewer is bound to find a lot to disagree with. I hope my disagreements will not obscure the fact that I found this a thoroughly stimulating book. I recommend it with great enthusiasm.


Brown, Bryson, and Graham Priest 2004. "Chunk and Permeate, a Paraconsistent Reasoning Strategy, I: The Infinitesimal Calculus". Journal of Philosophical Logic 33: 379-88.

Field, Hartry forthcoming. "Truth and the Unprovability of Consistency".

[1] Conversely, accepting a contradiction requires accepting the truth of a contradiction only given the introduction rule α ├ True(<α>). This rule too seems eminently reasonable, and Priest accepts it; but some who write on the paradoxes don't, and there could conceivably be responses to the paradoxes that accept contradictions but disallow the claim that any of them are true.

[2] A derivation directly from Intersubstitutivity is possible, obviating the need to assume Modus Ponens.

[3] Priest writes in places (e.g., p. 83) as if dialetheism provides a unified solution to the paradoxes of truth, in the sense that all paradoxical sentences turn out to be both true and false. But this is false advertising: one of the most recalcitrant paradoxes involves the Curry sentence (which asserts that if it itself is true then the earth is flat), and Priest is compelled not to regard it as both true and false but simply to regard it as false. (The assumption that it is true entails that the earth is flat, in any theory with the truth schema and Modus Ponens, irrespective of whether it is also false.) The paradox is blocked not by dialetheism but by a nonstandard account of the conditional.

[4] Indeed, presumably we're in a position to solely reject it, i.e. reject it without simultaneously not rejecting it!

[5] This may seem to be defining one notion in terms of an equivalent one; but on p. 81 Priest notes that it enables us to derive the equivalence of ¬¬α with α from the assumption that the relation of contradictoriness is symmetric.

[6] It might be proposed that the appropriate conditional for truth-preservation isn't True(<γ>) → True(<δ>) (involving Priest's →) but rather True(<γ>) True(<δ>), i.e. ¬True(<γ>) True(<δ>). But that would be an uninteresting reading of truth-preservation, since on Priest's theory Modus Ponens fails for .