Drawing Morals: Essays in Ethical Theory

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Thomas Hurka, Drawing Morals: Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford University Press, 2011, 276pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199743094.

Reviewed by Gwen Bradford, Rice University


Drawing Morals is a collection of essays by Thomas Hurka in value theory and normative ethics. The selections span almost his entire career, the earliest having been originally published in 1982 and the most recent appearing in Nous in 2010.

Hurka is known primarily for his work in value theory, chiefly as a leading proponent of perfectionism. The book collects several of Hurka's essays discussing issues related to perfectionism as well as other influential essays in various topics in value theory, including his engaging piece on the intrinsic value of playing games, and other pieces reflective of his influential work in other areas of ethics, including consequentialism and just war theory.

One might be inclined to describe this book as the more advanced or grown up sibling of his other Oxford book published this year, The Best Things in Life, which is a synthesis of Hurka's central views on the good life distilled into a concise and genial monograph suitable for a general audience. Unlike The Best Things, Drawing Morals contains no new material, and whereas the monograph format of The Best Things required Hurka to reconcile aspects of his views that may be in tension, the collection of essays doesn't require this. As a result, it leaves some engaging philosophical work up to the reader to attempt to reconcile apparent tensions.

The selections are thematically grouped into four sections: methodology; two middle sections on value theory; and the final section on principles of right action. Of the parts in value theory, the first contains papers on aggregation and comparisons of goods, including "Value and Population Size" and "Two Kinds of Organic Unity," among other selections; the second concerns the nature of various goods themselves, including virtue, desert, autonomy, and games. So the focus of the collection is Hurka's key essays on value theory and normative ethics, and does not include any papers on the history of philosophy (although Hurka has a rich discussion of the "golden age" of value theory in his methodological essay); nor anything on metaethics. If there is any complaint to be made about the nature of the selections, it might be that the final section is a bit of a grab-bag: a very early piece on capital punishment, a piece on satisficing (which is largely criticism of Michael Slote's view), a piece on just war theory, and Hurka's influential piece on national pride.

To a certain extent, one might wonder what motivates such a collection. All the articles already appear in print -- in fact, three of the 15 already appear twice in print, as journal articles and again as chapters in monographs ("The Well-Rounded Life" and "Why Value Autonomy?" are both from chapters of Perfectionism, and "How Great a Good Is Virtue?" is a chapter in Virtue, Vice and Value).

But there is of course good reason for this collection. It presents a unified picture of Hurka's overall philosophical program, and presents the diverse elements of his view in a unified way and in a new context. There is also symbolic significance: it solidifies Hurka's position among the most important philosophers in the field whose work merits being read multiple times.

Further, as a whole, the book subtly communicates a new point: the collection is illustrative of Hurka's methodology -- what he calls the structural method. Opening the collection with his recent piece on methodology, "Normative Ethics: Back to the Future" (which originally appeared in Brian Leiter's collection The Future for Philosophy), shows the essays in the rest of the book in a new context and reveals the merits of the structural approach.

As Hurka sees it, philosophy as a whole in recent years has been overly preoccupied with foundational work: explaining why a particular position is correct and defending it against objections. Hurka's message is that equally important work can be done engaging in structural, descriptive accounts of a positive view, in exploring the logical space of approaches to understanding a particular concept or phenomenon, and drawing the details of the relations among its various aspects.

As Hurka explains in the introduction, graphs are a tool of the structural method, and the title of the book is presumably a play on drawing conclusions about morality and drawing graphs. Graphs, as an element of the structural approach, aren't meant to make or block objections, but to illustrate points visually and lead us to consider new aspects of positions. For example, a graph might illustrate the relationship between the amount of a particular good and its value: the value of the good might be such that it increases proportionately to the amount of the good; whereas for some other good, the value of that good might increase less as its amount gets greater.

Some philosophers are skeptical of the use of graphs in this way: drawing morals is productive only if moral ideas do indeed follow regular, graphable patterns. What reason do we have to believe that there are such regular patterns at all in morality? Perhaps morality is ineffable and so wildly particularistic as to defy such oversimplifications.

But such a complaint is out of place: the burden of proof lies on the other side. Why wouldn't there be reason to think that morality follows regular patterns? After all, a great many patterns in the universe are regular and can be graphed and captured in mathematical formulae (laws of physics, plant growth, patterns of human psychology, sociology, animal reproduction, various other biological cycles). Morality may or may not be part of the natural universe, but it is indeed a part of the universe insofar as it is a part of our lives. Representable patterns abound in a variety of domains, so we might even say that we have more reason to think that (at least some) aspects of morality are indeed graphically representable than that none of them are.

Hurka's exhortation to the structural view is compelling: the absence of a foundational account in no way precludes fruitful philosophy. However, this doesn't entail that there is nothing interesting about asking for foundations. Why simply stop when it seems that there are further questions that we could indeed ask? Moreover, as rewarding as the structural approach can be shown to be, the foundationalist worries are not precluded.

Hurka argues for the virtues of structuralism and shows that it is a worthwhile approach. But what he does not attempt to do is show structuralism to be superior to foundationalism, or, more strongly, that there is no need for foundationalism. Ultimately, then, Hurka's arguments do not fully assuage the foundationalist worry that the absence of a good foundational story may generate reason to be skeptical of the theory. As intuitively plausible as a theory may be, if we look and cannot find an explanation for it, it seems reasonable to have some skeptical reservation about the theory, particularly when compared to theories that do have foundational explanations.

Further, one of Hurka's complaints is that favoring foundationalism leads us astray by generating accounts that bend too much toward the theory and too far away from intuitive plausibility. But one can imagine that the structural approach is also subject to leading us astray, albeit for different reasons: just how worthwhile is a structural account if it elaborates all the nuanced details of a view that is ultimately wrong? Comparisons to chmess come to mind: a misguided structural account would be the equivalent of devoting oneself to strategies for chmess, a made-up game similar to chess except the king moves two places rather than one. (Indeed, such a structural account would be worse than chmess, since at least chmess strategies are a priori truths, whereas the structural details of a theory that fails to capture reality is simply false.)

However, this is not a complaint about the structural enterprise as such: my point is simply that neither approach to philosophical investigation should be done without any of the other.

When combined, certain views of Hurka's generate some peculiarities, one of which I will explore here. According to Hurka's recursive account of virtue, which he discusses in "How Great a Good is Virtue?", virtue (roughly speaking) is a matter of loving the good and hating the bad, and vice is hating the good and loving the bad. "Loving" and "hating" are here taken broadly, and extend to other pro-attitudes as well, such as being pleased, enjoying, pursuing; and hating extends to include other con attitudes, such as being pained, avoiding, or destroying. The recursive pro- or con-attitudes, according to this view, have intrinsic value, and thus virtue is of intrinsic positive value and vice is of intrinsic negative value. For example, suppose A is happy and this is intrinsically good, and B is pleased by A's happiness. According to the recursive account, B's joy in A's happiness is virtuous, and is intrinsically valuable. Additionally, it is a feature of the view that the value of the recursive attitudes is less than the value of their base. So if A is experiencing pleasure, and B has virtuous joy toward A's pleasure, B's joy is less valuable than A's pleasure. Similarly, if C is pained by A's pleasure, C's pain is a vice, and of intrinsic negative value. Proportionately, the value of C's pain would be less bad, qua vice, than A's pleasure is good, since C's pain is a recursive attitude, whereas A's pleasure is a base good.

When we consider this aspect of the recursive view -- namely, that the value of the recursive attitudes is less than that of their base -- with another point of Hurka's, some eccentric implications arise. In "Asymmetries in Value," Hurka argues that (to put it roughly) pain is a worse bad than pleasure is a good. That is, comparing a pleasure and a pain of the same magnitude, the intrinsic positive value of the pleasure will be less good than the intrinsic negative value of the pain is bad.

Consider again C, who is pained by A's pleasure. According to the recursive account of virtue, C's pain in A's pleasure is a vice, and therefore intrinsically bad. Recall that recursive attitudes are of lesser value than their base, which implies that C's vicious pain is a relatively small bad.

However, according to the asymmetry view, C's pain is a relatively large bad, qua pain: C's pain is a worse bad qua pain than it is qua vice. As a result, then, C's pain is an appropriate object for virtuous compassion. D's compassionate pain for C's pain would be virtuous and valuable. In fact, if the magnitude of a pro-attitude is determined by the size of its object, it is a better good that D feel worse for C's pain than he should feel for C's vice: D's valuable attitudes would be a strong feeling of pity toward pain and a relatively weak pained disapproval toward the vice.

Stranger still, it would be appropriate and valuable for C to feel sorry for himself given his pain, implying that self-pity for one's pain is a virtue and valuable. Thus C could mitigate some of the evil of his vice by having virtuous compassion toward himself given that he is in pain, and this is a worse bad than his vice.

I suspect Hurka's response here would be to point out that because the pain is vicious pain, its viciousness is actually an integral element of the pain, which makes it inappropriate as an object of compassion -- it's not pain simpliciter, but it is malicious envy pain. Yet the point remains that in order to make sense of the asymmetry between the relative value of pleasures and pains, pain is a worse bad than pleasure is a good: so just how bad is the vicious pain? Not very bad, because it's a recursive attitude, or very bad because it's pain?

Perhaps the solution is to simply say that vices involving pains are worse intrinsically than virtues involving pleasures are good. In "How Great a Good is Virtue?" Hurka argues that virtues are a lesser good relative to the other goods such as knowledge and achievement, so perhaps Hurka would be amenable to this implication of his views. However, the examples here illustrate that virtue is an extremely lesser good: virtue is a lesser good relative to the badness of pain, and a lesser good qua virtue relative to its base, and a lesser good relative to other goods. Thus virtue is a lesser good in three different ways -- one might even say that virtue is triply a lesser good. This conclusion truly flies in the face of the traditional thought that virtue is the greatest good. Whether or not that is a desirable implication of Hurka's view, I'm not sure.

Further, we have this perplexing peculiarity that plagues the recursive account: Hurka is committed to saying that B's vicious pleasure is both bad qua vice and good qua pleasure. But what does this mean, exactly? How can something have both intrinsic positive value and intrinsic negative value at the same time? There is one person here with one particular experience of pleasure, which, on the whole, has some valence of intrinsic value, either good or bad, and it has that valence to some degree. Surely to say that it is both good and bad overall at the same time is like saying something is both red and green all over.

But one should hope and expect that intriguing puzzles emerge from a collection of essays like this. Perhaps the most important moral to be drawn from Drawing Morals is that Hurka's structural method and the insights he explores will continue to engender further philosophizing.