Duns Scotus's Theory of Cognition

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Richard Cross, Duns Scotus's Theory of Cognition, Oxford University Press, 2014, 224pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199684885.

Reviewed by Henrik Lagerlund, University of Western Ontario


John Duns Scotus (c. 1266-1308) is one of the great medieval philosophers, but also one of the most difficult. Very few outside the group of scholars that work on medieval philosophy have probably read more than a few passages by him and fewer still have really tried to penetrate the original Latin writings of Scotus. It does not make it easier that the most important work by Scotus is the various existing versions of his commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, which is not for the faint hearted. It is hence no surprise that much scholarship on Scotus is also obscure, difficult to penetrate and, frankly, hardly worth the time.

The work of Richard Cross stands in sharp contrast to this. He is in my mind one of the few who have the ability to make Scotus understandable, clear and philosophically interesting. It is always a delight to pick up one of his books on Scotus. I constantly learn something new. He has now published a new book on Scotus's theory of cognition. It is another very interesting treatment of an important aspect of Scotus's philosophy.

There has been a disproportionately large focus on medieval theories of cognition and philosophical psychology in general over the last ten years. Scotus has of course had a central place in that discussion, but no philosophically sophisticated overview of Scotus's treatment of cognition has been available before this book. Over ten chapters, Cross deals with everything from sensation to thought and mental content. It is very clearly written and with references to other medieval philosophers when needed as well as to some contemporary theories for reference and clarification. It is overall excellent and thought provoking. Some parts naturally stand out, though.

The first chapter, after a very useful introduction, deals with the issue of sensation and the not all too clear discussion in Scotus about sensible and intelligible species. Scotus considerably deepens the analysis of these concepts, however. Interestingly he notes, for example, that we humans cannot have what Cross calls de re cognition of singulars, that is, a cognition of an individual thing as the very individual it is. This implies that there is always a general or universal element to cognition, which distinguishes him from Ockham, but not from Buridan, for example, among his fourteenth-century followers. The argument Scotus uses for this is by reference to the principle of indiscernibility. If we had de re cognition of sensibles, we could distinguish two otherwise indiscernible instances of a kind, Scotus argues, which he thinks is impossible.

This is interesting in many ways and Cross develops this issue as he goes on in chapters 2 to 4 to discuss the famous distinction Scotus makes between intuitive and abstractive cognition. Cross describes the distinction in the following way:

Intuitive cognition has as its object something existent and present -- the singular and its nature, the nature joined to its individuator. The object of abstractive cognition is (standardly) the common nature, but abstraction precludes existence and presence, and in so doing (it seems) basically excludes the individuating feature. (64)

One way of putting this is to say that an intuitive cognition is of the common nature with its individuating principle, that is, as it exists in individuals, while an abstractive cognition is of the common nature in itself without individuating principle.

Scotus also discusses how we get from this common nature in the individual to the common nature cognized distinctly as a universal kind or species. It is very interesting and very intricate, having to do with confused cognition of a singular, which includes the universal, to a confused cognition of the universal and then to a distinct cognition of the common nature. It is clearly outlined by Cross, but it would have been nice to bring this discussion into its context in later fourteenth-century thought. Buridan and his followers, particularly Nicholas Oresme, develop these ideas of Scotus in various detail and they are related to a discussion found already in Avicenna.[1] Cross misses the opportunity to not only clarify Scotus's position, but also place him into a larger context of a long-standing debate.

Despite this omission, the discussion of sensory and intellectual cognition in the first few chapters is very illuminating, but not as interesting as the latter half of the book, which deals with intentionality and mental content. Chapters 8 to 10 are amazingly interesting. Chapter 8 is about Scotus's semantic internalism and the grounds for intentionality, chapter 9 is about mental language and conceptual content, and chapter 10 is about the ontological status of mental content. These three chapters together are a philosophical gold mine.

In the beginning of chapter 8, Cross draws a distinction between intentionalityR and intentionalityI. The first picks out the thing or act that has a mental representation, that is, basically the vehicle of representation, while the second picks out the representation itself, that is, the content of the vehicle. This is followed by the stating of three startling and highly interesting views defended by Cross and attributed to Scotus. He first of all argues that Scotus is an internalist about content, that is, about intentionalityI, and hence that conceptual content is to be grounded in the real structure of the cognitive act itself. Again intentionalityR grounds intentionalityI.

The second view defended is that Scotus holds an elementary account of a mental language theory. This is quite surprising since most scholars would attribute the origins of such a theory to William Ockham. The important move that Cross attributes to Scotus is that "syntactically structured concepts are built out of distinct simples (lacking syntactic structure), with appropriate syntactic connectors." (174) This attributes some kind of linguistic structure to thought. It is important to note that Scotus does not operationalize this to any great extent and it remains not much more than a suggestion and a skeleton of a theory. It is, however, noteworthy that the basic idea is there and combined with a principle of compositionality as well.

The third noteworthy idea defended in these chapters is that the mental content is reducible to the mental act, that is, intentionalityI reduces to intentionalityR, or, put again differently, the mental representation reduces to the vehicle of representation. This is again a startling view and seems to make Scotus out to be a proto-Ockhamist. This is, namely, the position of the later Ockham, which argues that the content reduces to the act of cognition, and it is the foundation of his functionalism. The great difference between the two, although Ockham's position is much more worked out, seems to be Scotus's internalism, which stands in sharp contrast to Ockham's externalism.

Much more needs to be said about this cluster of ideas attributed to Scotus by Cross. I am for one puzzled about the nature of his internalism, and I am baffled by the two others. I am also worried about the internal consistency of this view. What does it amount to? Is he an Aristotelian or a Humean or something in between? I cannot make up my mind. It is clear that Cross has set scholarship up for an interesting debate about some fascinating philosophical problems. I urge you to read the book and make up your own mind. It is the clearest and most interesting treatment of Scotus's theory of cognition out there.

[1] See Deborah Black's extremely interesting article "Avicenna's 'Vague Individual' and Its Impact on Medieval Latin Philosophy". It even relates this issue to Scotus and addresses its relevance for the notion of intuitive cognition. I have also written about the relation of ideas in Avicenna and Scotus to Buridan and Oresme. See Henrik Lagerlund, "What is Singular Thought? Ockham and Buridan on Singular Terms in the Language of Thought", in Vesa Hirvonen, Toivo Holopainen and Miira Tuominen (eds.) Mind and Modality: Studies in the History of Philosophy in Honour of Simo Knuuttila (Leiden: Brill, 2006: 217-238). Lagerlund, "Singular Terms and Vague Concepts in Late Medieval Mental Language Theory: Or, the Decline and Fall of Mental Language", in Gyula Klima (ed.) Intentionality, Cognition, and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy (New York: Fordham University Press, 2014: 122-140).