Dying for Ideas: The Dangerous Lives of the Philosophers

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Costica Bradatan, Dying for Ideas: The Dangerous Lives of the Philosophers, Bloomsbury, 2015, 256pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781472525512.

Reviewed by Michael Cholbi, California State Polytechnic University


Costica Bradatan's book is an investigation into how death can serve as a philosophical act: "how a philosopher can make a 'good use' of her death and how, in so doing, she re-signifies her life and makes her work whole." (6) Through the lives and deaths of five philosopher-martyrs (Socrates, Hypatia, Thomas More, Giordano Bruno, and Jan Patočka), Bradatan attempts to illustrate how philosophical martyrdom, the act by which a philosopher puts her body "on the line" (7) and thereby treats the body like a text, is itself an act of philosophical persuasion. Such martyrdom, Bradatan proposes, elevates these philosophers into the realm of the mythical, enlarging the intellectual shadows cast by their other more logocentric philosophical activities,

The first chapter draws upon the lives and works of Pico della Mirandola, Montaigne, Vico, Nietzsche, and Hadot to articulate an understanding of philosophy as an enterprise of self-fashioning. The work of philosophers, according to Bradatan, is to continually re-invent themselves. (23) The philosophical self at any given moment is only a rough draft, a work in progress created "from scratch." (24) Chapter Two addresses what Bradatan calls the "first layer" of philosopher-martyrdom, philosophers' intellectual confrontations with death in the abstract. Here Heidegger, Tolstoy, and Paul-Louis Landsberg play starring roles. Chapter Three turns to Bradatan's aforementioned five philosopher-martyrs, emphasizing how their self-chosen deaths enabled their own bodies to speak for them philosophically. In the fourth chapter, Bradatan considers how death "looks at" philosophers, with discussions of how Socrates and More readied themselves for death. The final chapter analyzes the conditions that must be met in order for philosophers to achieve martyrdom via death. According to Bradatan, philosopher-martyrdom can only be achieved if the philosopher has a stage, i.e., lives in sociohistorical circumstances that render his death publicly visible; has a life story capable of elevating his death (and his ife) into the realm of myth; and an audience primed to disseminate this myth.

My brief summary does not do justice to the sometimes dazzling erudition on display in the book. Bradatan weaves together philosophy and biography to discuss his chosen philosopher-martyrs, interjecting bits of film criticism and analysis of pictorial art along the way. Of particular note are fascinating discussions of Edvard Munch's 'Self-Portrait with Skeleton Arm' (Bradatan observes how Munch, by depicting himself with only his hand in skeletal form, provides "a representation of our finitude at its most devastating" (49-50)) and the infamous chess scene in Bergman's The Seventh Seal, which Bradatan unconventionally interprets as displaying our encounter with death as an end in itself, an act by which we can give "life a redeeming meaning." Bradatan also draws attention to philosophers whose work deserves to be more widely known. Landsberg, for example, was a student of Husserl and Heidegger who converted to Catholicism. Bradatan nicely outlines how, in his Essay on the Experience of Death (1936), Landsberg demonstrated how the deaths of others makes death personal to us and points the way toward death as essential to our prospects for self-realization.

Bradatan's thesis -- that martyrdom can contribute to our sense of a philosopher's "work" -- seems generally correct. Certainly Socrates would not be heralded as the father of the Western philosophical tradition were he not executed by his fellow Athenians.

Despite these attractive features, Dying for Ideas is likely to disappoint, even frustrate, many philosophical readers. Some of the sources of this disappointment or frustration are stylistic. As with many monographs, the book could easily have been half as long without significant loss. To a large degree, this is a byproduct of Bradatan's aforementioned breadth of knowledge. Beyond this, Bradatan uses rhetorical devices that are evidently intended to be playful but are instead distracting or didactic. The book is interspersed with intermezzi, lasting anywhere from a paragraph to six pages, apparently aimed at contextualizing the topic at hand but which instead distract from the main exposition. On multiple occasions, Bradatan claims to know the readers' reactions to this work. We are purportedly "smiling" (59) after his elaboration of Heidegger on being-toward-death. I was not.

Granted, these criticisms may merely reflect my taste. But his book has more substantive limitations as well. Bradatan does not pretend to offer a linear historical narrative, yet he makes sweeping controversial historical claims without much defense. He proclaims that "From the Renaissance on, there is a distinct sense that the self is something to be created 'from scratch.'" (24) A sense that the self is created from scratch? Perhaps. But a good many post-Renaissance figures have held that the self is discovered rather than created (Descartes most notoriously), while other post-Renaissance figures (Hume) were skeptical of 'selves' altogether. Likewise, Bradatan offers an interpretation of Socrates as living an "actor's life," donning an "uninterrupted succession of masks" (162) as part of his efforts at self-fashioning. We should, according to Bradatan, disregard Socrates' repeated disavowals of the fear of death. His speech in the Apology is Socrates' attempt to convince himself that death is not to be feared, not an attempt to convince the jury of that claim. Socrates doth protest too much, says Bradatan: "Socrates is too insistent on having no fear of death not to draw our attention and suspicion. Someone who was not afraid of dying would spend less time talking about death." (131) While irony no doubt has a role in Socrates' rhetoric, Bradatan at least owes his readers an acknowledgement that this neo-Straussian approach to these texts is highly controversial.

Unsurprisingly, Bradatan views martyrdom as a technique by which philosophers ratify their own philosophical convictions, the ultimate act of integrity. By putting her body where her mouth is, the philosopher-martyr literally makes it true that her convictions are worth dying for. Curiously though, Bradatan assumes a largely unrestricted view about the relationship between a philosopher's martyrdom and her convictions. The range of philosophical positions represented by Socrates, Hypatia, More, Bruno, and Patočka is obviously extremely broad. Yet Bradatan seems largely to suppose that understanding their respective martyrdoms is independent of understanding their respective philosophical convictions. Any philosopher can (should?) be a martyr regardless of her philosophical convictions, and martyrdom has the same philosophical meaning regardless of the martyr's philosophical convictions.

But the relationship between philosophical martyrdom and a philosopher's convictions is not, in my estimation, as loose as Bradatan presents it. For one thing, Bradatan espouses certain views about the nature of death that a philosopher must apparently adopt in order for her martyrdom to be intelligible. Among these are the aforementioned view of philosophy as an exercise in self-fashioning for which death serves as the narrative finale and the claim that the nature of our postmortem existence is unknowable. (43, 47) But at least some of the philosopher-martyrs Bradatan discusses did not share these convictions. More, the devout Catholic, would certainly have rejected them. Likewise, Socrates would not recognize himself in these claims. He goes to his death with a confidence, perhaps misplaced, that what awaits him is the survival of his soul in a glorious afterlife spent basking in the Forms.

My concern is not that Bradatan does not defend these views regarding the nature of death and the afterlife. He admits he does not. (We are supposed to be reassured by the fact that his book is not "about making arguments," 11.) Rather, what philosophers do in their acts of martyrdom cannot be so cleanly divorced from what they do as philosophers. In the case of More and Socrates, it is not even clear that, given their belief that death would not be the end of their conscious existences, they count as martyrs in the first place. Martyrs, Bradatan observes, engage in self-sacrifice. But neither of these 'martyrs' believed he was putting his self out of existence, or that his death was a sacrifice. Granted, this may merely entail that More and Socrates were unwitting or unknowing martyrs. Yet then it becomes perplexing why we should be intellectually fascinated by such 'martyrs.' If they understood their deaths neither as efforts to fashion a philosophical persona nor as placing themselves on the line for their philosophical convictions, then it becomes harder to see their deaths as worthy of emulation.

In a similar vein, it also seems possible that the skillful avoidance of death could be no less an act of philosophical integrity than martyrdom. The two great figures of the English contract tradition, Hobbes and Locke, showed impressive dexterity in living to robust old age despite their entanglements with often powerful political adversaries. Nowadays no one remembers the unremarkable circumstances of their deaths. Yet that is how it ought to be since a theme tacit in both philosophers' work is that there is not as much worth dying for as some philosophers have supposed -- that philosophy as an art of living is the art of staying alive in a world often riven by conflict and violence. In evading martyrdom, Hobbes and Locke no less 'resignified' their lives or 'made their work whole' than did Bradatan's philosopher-martyrs. In a sense, Locke and Hobbes vindicate Bradatan's thesis rather than undermine it: a philosopher's mode of dying, even including the assiduous avoidance of death, can represent a philosophical act. But the relationship between such modes of dying, their meaning, and the philosopher's intellectual outlook is more complicated than Bradatan appears to suppose. We thus learn less about philosophy from Bradatan's discussion of philosopher-martyrdom than we might hope.

Bradatan's book is better when it detaches philosophy from martryrdom altogether. He provides a first rate discussion of martyrdom in the Christian and Islamic traditions (110-13), as well as an insightful examination of the contrasts in aims and motivations among those who starve themselves to death as protest, self-immolate, and become suicide bombers. In each of these phenomena, the body speaks in a different political way. The self-immolator, for instance, attempts to invite an encounter with an audience of guilty consciences, whereas the suicide bomber aims to terrorize society rather than move it to act through the recognition of the justice of his cause.

In the end, Dying for Ideas is a plea for a philosophical way of life that transcends the academic -- for philosophy where something tangible is at stake. While martyrdom is less central to such a way of life than Bradatan suggests, no one can doubt the sincerity or urgency of his plea.