Dying For Time: Proust, Woolf, Nabokov

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Martin Hägglund, Dying For Time: Proust, Woolf, Nabokov, Harvard University Press, 2012, 198pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674066328.

Reviewed by Humberto Brito, Universidade Nova de Lisboa


Martin Hägglund develops a sustained attack on what he considers to be immortality fantasies. We might equally describe it as an attack on the belief in redemption, as it reviles the intelligibility of any "state of eternity", as well as all descriptions of an individual human life as "a path to the salvation of eternity" (88). This attack is based on the author's prefatory distinction between immortality and survival. There is no such thing as a sense of the timeless, he claims. We are simply not equipped to grasp a state of eternity. The pictures of immortality we can articulate are thus unavoidably temporalized. It follows, Hägglund argues, that wanting to be immortal is nothing but wanting to live on as a mortal. It is an expression of a desire for survival, which originates in our attachment to our temporal lives, understood as "the source of both what one desires and what one fears, both the desirable and the undesirable" (9). In addition, since "immortality would not allow anything to live on in time", the "desire to perpetuate a temporal being is incompatible with a desire to be immortal" (7).

Since we are unable to entertain a sense of the timeless, we cannot seriously entertain the desire of an unending life, Hägglund suggests. All we are left with is what he chooses to call (notice the economic metaphor) an "investment in survival". A continuation of Radical Atheism -- his vindication of Derrida's allegiance to the idea that there is nothing beyond mortality (like il n'y a pas de hors-texte) -- this new book takes the atheist conception of existence as merely self-evident. Hägglund rightly suggests that the way we fashion our lives ("what one desires and what one fears") is structured by our apprehension of our "constitutive attachment to temporal life" (88), in virtue of which no one is indifferent to what becomes of her earthly transit. (Hägglund is careful to argue that any religious or ethical ideal of detachment from temporal existence only "dissimulates a previous attachment to temporal life", 9; see also 88, 112, 158). In non-economical terms, the idea of an investment in survival simply means we normally care about the good of our temporal lives. Of course, the word 'good' might be repurposed here in a vaguely economical idiom as anything we fear losing:

The key argument here concerns the co-implication of chronophonia and chronophilia. The fear of time and death does not stem from a metaphysical desire to transcend temporal life. On the contrary, it is generated by the investment in a life that can be lost. It is because one is attached to a temporal being (chronophilia) that one fears losing it (chronophobia). (9)

It is striking that Hägglund should take caring about our lives, in a general sense, as a token (this time, notice the pathological allusion) of an "incurable condition" (11; see also 167). He calls this condition "chronolibido": the condition under which the co-implication of chronophobia and chronophilia is operative. This co-implication is necessary, he argues, because "the fear of death is operative in relation to everything one cares about" (11; see also 115). This chronolibidinal doctrine concerning desire is furthered -- contra Freud and Lacan -- in chapter 4, where he elaborates on the "double bind of survival": "The investment in survival is the condition for any care for life and resistance to death, but it is also the condition for any resentment of life and desire for death", as one learns from "the experience of mourning", in the sense that it "elucidates the inherent violence of living on" (116-117). Hägglund's tour de force, trying to establish a general theory of chronolibido, resorts once again to metaphors from economics (e.g., "bonds", "investments", "losses", "expectations"). Indeed, what he had promised as a "systematic articulation of the logic of chronolibido" (12) is reduced in chapter 4 to the logic of "libidinal economy" (13; see also 113).

Put another way, everything we care about is here reducible to chronolibidinal economy, according to which any libidinal investment (Freud's "cathexis", Besetzung), or "everything one cares about", originates in personal fear of death, in one's apprehension of temporal finitude. The trouble, however, is that this makes it seem as though all a person cares for is the kind of thing which can be the object of an investment, in Hägglund's sense of the word (i.e., 'the impossibility of being indifferent to survival'). A considerable number of counterexamples come to mind. For instance, any connection between my specific desire for a BLT sandwich, say, and my fear of death, would have to be quite recondite. "Baconphilia" certainly seems to be a rather more reasonable explanation. Less trivially, suppose I happen to care about a stranger in distress. In what sense does my specific concern to help that stranger originate in chronophobia? It would be of little help to respond that chronolibido only applies to my concern with my own life. For helping a stranger may stem in part, or in certain instances, from my intention of being the kind of person who does not ignore a stranger in distress.

At this point, a critic might perhaps suggest that the idea of a chronolibidinal economy is not really only a symptom of atheism, but also of hypertrophic self-awareness. It is telling that Hägglund's guiding intuition is that we can elucidate chronolibido in reference to how our human experience of time was depicted, or rather magnified, by three modernist writers (Proust, Woolf, and Nabokov). Strikingly, he takes their pictures of temporal self-awareness as final word on the topic. Hägglund offers a forceful, lucid, and rigorous account of how their work epitomizes a "chronolibidinal aesthetics": that is to say, of how they are able capture certain typical modes of "chronolibinal anxiety" (106). In brief, Hägglund is interested in: how Proust saw our sense of the past, how Woolf saw our sense of the present, and how Nabokov's idea of writing is the quintessential figure of the notion of chronolibidinal investment in survival.

More specifically, Hägglund focuses on Proust's treatment of involuntary memory, Woolf's treatment of epiphanic "moments of being", and Nabokov's depiction of the activity of writing. Traditionally, however, these very topics have been taken to elucidate the way these authors contrived a sense of the timeless in their works. In order to show that these are, on the contrary, supreme instances of "chronolibidinal aesthetics", Hägglund must deconstruct the canonical scholarship on each of those topics.

He skillfully explains in chapter 1 that Proust is interested not in revealing some "timeless essence" in À la recherche du temps perdu, as is widely assumed, but in showing involuntary memory relative to the sense of loss and personal extinction originated in an acute attention to the passage of time. No less skillfully, we are told in chapter 2 that Woolf's representation of presence in To the Lighthouse and Mrs. Dalloway does not aim to display a sense of "timeless presence", as commonly supposed, but an inexorable, and possibly terrifying, sense of the transience of presence. In chapter 3, he offers an interpretation of Nabokov's dramatization of the act of writing in Ada or Ardor in reference to what he takes to be the negativity of time, in which writing is understood as a tool to cope with the texture of time and the destructibility of memory.

These are admirable essays, which surely deserve careful reading. Their iconoclastic and well-argued theses will have an impact on the specialized scholarship. But a caveat on style is perhaps helpful for potential readers. If you are normally not impressed by the clarity of the Derridian idiom and how it resonates in contemporary theory and criticism, Hägglund's book is probably the context to train your patience. A charitable reader will comfortably disregard not only the heavy use of a glamorous lexicon ('death', 'violence', 'trauma', 'loss', 'mourning', 'despair', 'survival', etc.), but also the disenchanted gravitas with which it is deployed. Strip away the gory, if also trendy, paraphernalia, and you shall find a serious discussion. To give an example, the ghastly connection Hägglund wants to establish in chapter 2 between the negative structure of time and the "traumatic" character of Woolf's "moments of being", is not entirely compelling.

Hägglund argues that the "very epiphany of presence in Woolf is a traumatic event, since it can come into being only by becoming past (too soon) and becoming future (too late)." (156) In other words, "Woolf's aesthetics of the moment highlights the traumatic deferral and delay at the heart of temporal existence": i.e., "The condition of temporality is, strictly speaking, 'undecidable', since it consists in a relentless displacement that unsettles any definitive assurance or given meaning", and this makes it potentially traumatic (62). So, grasping the present is to grasp death, or what Hägglund solemnly calls moments of dying. Still, suppose he is right about the nature of time: "I argue that time is nothing in itself; it is nothing but the negativity that is intrinsic to succession", 15 (I will not even enter a debate on such a difficult topic). Even then, the condition of temporality is no more a potential source of trauma than it is a source of, say, surprise. If by a "relentless displacement that unsettles any definitive assurance or given meaning" he means that life is always open to surprise, the need to paint this fact with direful colors is beyond justification.

I will make two final remarks on the idea that we should surrender belief in a state of eternity to an investment in survival. It is not clear how the ordinary, if consequential, awareness of our "constitutive attachment to temporal life" is supposed to confute belief in the unending life of the soul. Certainly no theist seriously thinks her temporal life is not constitutively attached to temporal, material, finitude. Besides, one need not be an atheist in order to wonder if the idea of an unending life, or of an immortal substance, is within the reach of the mortal intellect. Perhaps we simply lack the metaphysical equipment needed to make such a conception of existence intelligible. It is also not clear that such investment in survival, or such desire to perpetuate one's temporal life, or the fear of losing it, necessarily follows from one's awareness of mortality. We should keep in mind that Hägglund takes the idea of an investment in survival to be our default mode of relating to the world, and in some fundamental sense he is right. Still, there is a sense in which -- in certain circumstances, at least -- we may not fear the loss of the life we have.