The Invention of Jewish Identity: Bible, Philosophy, and the Art of Translation

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Aaron W. Hughes, The Invention of Jewish Identity: Bible, Philosophy, and the Art of Translation, Indiana University Press, 2010, 176pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222497.

Reviewed by Randi Rashkover, George Mason University


A quick survey through the history of Jewish philosophy finds a frequent preoccupation of Jewish philosophers with the exercise of biblical translation, be it the translation of the Hebrew text to another language or the interpretation of the text into a different conceptual register. In his book The Invention of Jewish Identity: Bible, Philosophy, and the Art of Translation, Aaron Hughes takes this seemingly quotidian observation as the starting point for a novel investigation of the correlation between Jewish philosophy and translation.

Organized as a sequence of vignettes staging encounters between modern and medieval Jewish philosophers, The Invention of Jewish Identity yields the following set of claims about translation as performed by Jewish philosophers: 1) translation is much more than a strictly philological activity; 2) translation operates within the context of these philosophers' theologico-philosophical agendas; 3) if translation is influenced by the intellectual agendas of the thinkers who enlist it, the reverse is the case as well -- the act of translation influences and impacts upon these same philosophical/theological points of view.

In particular, translation operates as a microcosmic example of the extent to which existence transpires within language. As such however, existence is conditioned by the ontological and temporal limits of language. Existence is culturally conditioned and driven by the motivations and desires characteristic of persons' finite condition. From this vantage point, translation is one of the means by which linguistically conditioned persons both express the limits of this condition and attempt to negotiate them. However Hughes' argument implies, since philosophy too operates in language, then it is also the case that philosophy operates as a mode of translation -- that is, a product of its own cultural contexts, limits, drives and hopes, a perpetual negotiation between context and truth. That the object of the Jewish philosophers discussed in the book is always and everywhere the biblical text only adds to the ultimate philosophico-theological significance of their work. Biblical translation becomes in Hughes' account a key element in the nexus between Jewish philosophical thought, theological aspiration and the construction of cultural identity by way of the history of Jewish/non-Jewish interactions. So analyzed, our understanding of Jewish philosophy, its rules of operation and our rules of reading it through set periodizations and thematics is substantially changed.

Hughes begins his book with a focus on the translation activities of Franz Rosenzweig and Saadya Gaon -- two philosophers whose work is infrequently discussed side-by-side. Still, in chapter two, "The Forgetting of History and the Memory of Translation", Hughes illuminates their shared enlistment of biblical translation as a key exercise in unveiling their reverence for the Ursprache expressed uniquely in the Hebrew of the biblical text. Translation functions as a necessary instrument in the theological work of both thinkers. Both hold that "the Hebrew of the bible . . . represents but one idiom of this divine speech . . . and in their different ways, both Rosenzweig and Saadya signal the radical otherness of biblical language." (21)

A comparison between the translation activities of the two thinkers reveals a deeper point of resemblance when their shared interest in unveiling the primordial divine language is contextualized within the cultural influences of their own day. If, Hughes tells us, Rosenzweig's theological labor was inevitably enmeshed within his concern to embolden Judaism and Jewish culture in the context of the German domestication and domination over the biblical text, Saadya's theological work was driven by a deep concern for the loss of the text by the exiled community of tenth-century Arabic-speaking Jewry. For both, translation held out a unique opportunity to recover a lost text which nonetheless signaled the paradox of a repair that emerges out of the very conditions of alienation that must be overcome. "Both," says Hughes, "had to take the essential core of Hebrew revelation and harness it to a new language." Undoubtedly, Hughes reminds us, Rosenzweig insisted that translation not only illuminates Hebrew through German but changes the German into which it is translated in the process. Likewise, Saadya's translation of the Hebrew Bible into Arabic proceeds from the assumption that although

the bible . . . comes to Jews in the present through the veil of another language . . . nonetheless. . . the Hebrew original . . . transforms and ultimately breaks out of the semantic and grammatical casing of another language. The written Arabic . . . ultimately reveals the Hebrew behind it. (38)

In each case, translation means the retrieval of the past through the lens, limits, and cultural influences of the present.

In chapter three, "The Translation of Silence and the Silence of Translation: The Fabric of Metaphor", Hughes extends the notion of translation beyond the substitution of one literal language for another and uses it to consider and deepen our understanding of the translation of the biblical text into a different conceptual idiom as we find it in the work of the great medieval Jewish philosopher Moses Maimonides on the one hand and the distinguished Jewish poet Moses Ibn Ezra on the other.

Readers of the Guide of the Perplexed are familiar with Maimonides' effort to interpret anthropomorphic illocutions describing the divine into the language of philosophical concepts. It is, however, less common to understand Maimonides' philosophical hermeneutics as an exercise in translation and, more specifically, a mode of translation influenced by not only categories of Aristotelian and neo-Platonic philosophy but by the conventions and insights of the surrounding 'Arabic literary tradition'. Such is the novel approach taken by Hughes as he reads Maimonides' biblical hermeneutics through the lens of Maimonides' account of metaphor. Maimonides' focus upon metaphor, reflected, Hughes maintains, a similar focus within the Arabic literary tradition whereby it "was intimately connected to ascertaining the often porous contours between figurative and non-figurative language . . . a topic that witnessed its genesis in various theological debates concerning the proper meaning of the Qur'an." (46) Maimonides, Hughes recognizes, remained suspicious about the biblical text's invocation of metaphor but understood as well that de-coding it opened up access to a divine Urtext. So understood, the translation of metaphors assumes a crucial role in Maimonides' philosophical work. Beyond this, by interpreting Maimonides' philosophical work as an act of translation, Hughes uncovers what he maintains is Maimonides' culturally motivated drive to rid the biblical text of any embarrassing features. Maimonides' philosophical effort takes on the conflicts and problems characteristic of its Sitz im Leben.

Maimonides, Hughes argues, is not the only Jewish medievalist to enlist the instrument of metaphor in his larger project. Focus on and examination of the use of metaphor within the biblical text constituted a concern of the great Jewish poet Ibn Ezra. Frequently appreciated for his literarily rich reading of the figurative language of the biblical text, Ibn Ezra's work can be understood as translative, according to Hughes. Ibn Ezra he says, "singles metaphor out as the first and most indispensable of the twenty ornamental devices of rhetorical style." (48) But, Hughes continues, to understand metaphor for Ibn Ezra means to discern how a term's original meaning is ascribed to a new meaning -- i.e., how a word's meaning is translated into a new context. Still, Hughes continues, Ibn Ezra's enlistment of translation as a mode of deciphering figurative meaning presumed not only the generativity of metaphor as meaning but the slippage between metaphor and truth uncovered here as well. Both he and Maimonides remained committed to the labor of discerning metaphor and both understood the potential fallibility of human language hereby signified by it.

Chapter four, "The Apologetics of Translation", extends Hughes' strategy to the work of Judah Messer Moses Leon and Martin Buber, both of whom he suggests employed translation as part of their effort to celebrate the aesthetic glory of the biblical text as the greatest example of an ancient literary tradition. As was the case with the prior examples, the use of translation by each as a necessary element in their larger theological-religious project inevitably ties these efforts to the cultural conditions within which they worked. So situated, each thinker's attempt to identify the aesthetic superiority of the ancient biblical text inevitably took up the literary conventions of their respective times. Understood as a translative activity, the Jewish aesthetic apologetic of both thinkers comes to be understood as an exercise in the construction of a cultural past from out of the language, tools and conventions of a non-Jewish present. Referring to Judah Messer Leon's Sefer Nofet Zufim (The Book of the Honeycomb's Flow) and the Buber/Rosenzweig translation of the biblical text, Hughes maintains that "in their thinking about the necessity of translation, whether in twentieth-century German or in fifteenth-century Italy, each used contemporaneous aesthetic idioms as a way to restore/invent and to establish/shatter a Hebrew original using another language." (74)

Hughes' turn to translation as a tool through which readers may appreciate both a new focal point for Jewish philosophy and one that presents the work of this philosophy within its cultural context allows for new readings of old thinkers. However, throughout the book, Hughes suggests that the benefits of such are more than pedagogical. They help readers recognize translation as the philosophical activity par excellence. Hughes' celebration of translation's philosophical muscle is not without an admission of the potential problems frequently associated with it. Chapter five, "Translation and its Discontents", delineates a few of the most common critiques of the work of biblical translation; the opposing extremes of assimilation to the host language on the one hand and the parochialization or nostalgic ethnocentrism of the effort to return to the Jewish biblical tradition on the other hand. Beyond these two challenges lay a third, what Hughes refers to as the potential erasure of Hebrew when by way of translation, thinkers' efforts to extend access to the biblical text results in the positioning of Hebrew "behind the semantic curtain of other languages" (108). It may be Hughes suggests that such positioning discloses paradoxically Hebrew's sacred distinction from other ordinary languages or as he says "paves the way for the silent possibility of messianic fulfillment" (108) made possible through the perpetual work of its translation.

Still, it is not Hebrew which constitutes the locus of Hughes' philosophical hopes but, as mentioned above, translation itself. Hughes' final chapter, "Translation and Issues of Identity and Temporality", details two primary benefits of translation as a mode of philosophical work. First, although Hughes' admission, that reading philosophy as translation means reading philosophy in its cultural context, appears reductionist, he maintains to the contrary that an appreciation of the cultural, linguistic setting of Jewish philosophy grants it the context and tools for creative and life-preserving change. Philosophy read as translation means the construction of Jewish identity as this construction enacts the vital negotiation between the Jewish textual tradition, its philosophical-theological ideals, and its engagement with the non-Jewish world. At once, translation establishes key boundaries for Judaism and its texts, that is, it "seeks to verify the narrative as a source of wisdom" (9), all the while it operates as a "mirror wherein one sees in the Bible's words a reflection of oneself and of one's own understanding of what Judaism is or should be." (9)

Second, Hughes maintains that translation permits or stimulates persons to "think about connections between language and ontology." (125) If, as Heidegger maintained, human life enacts the very process of temporality, translation's essential negotiation between past, present and future repeats or mirrors the authentic character of human finitude thereby gaining its own badge of authenticity in Hughes' estimation. To the extent to which beyond sheer finitude translation's tireless campaign to exchange word for word, metaphor for truth, and ordinary language for Ursprache reveals a deeper capacity to point towards a 'more' which it never fully expresses, translation, says Hughes, "becomes the way that humans re-vector the established order and move the revelatory word toward the potential silence of creation and of redemption." (127) So understood, Hughes assigns translation a metaphysical meaning that readers might think conflicts with his own stated effort to appreciate the changeability of the Jewish philosophical tradition; the perpetual re-calibration of its cultural identity and theological and philosophical aspirations. Still, if Hughes' concluding remarks run the risk of hypostasizing the very tool which he claims de-essentializes our understanding of Jewish thought, they do not ultimately negate the value of the overall project which challenges the tiresome periodization of Jewish philosophy and permits an appreciation of it as an exercise in literary, theological and cultural creativity.