The Place of Landscape: Concepts, Contexts, Studies

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Jeff Malpas (ed.), The Place of Landscape: Concepts, Contexts, Studies, MIT Press, 2011, 368pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015523.

Reviewed by Glenn Parsons, Ryerson University


Though it can appear simple on the surface, the notion of landscape is a complex, even enigmatic one in our culture. Through the history of Western landscape painting it has become linked to aesthetic experience, through Romanticism it has come to carry spiritual weight, and, more recently, as a result of the Environmental movement, it has become a locus of anxiety and ethical debate. Further, just as these changes have reshaped our intellectual and emotional responses to the landscape, the relentless advances of industrialism have reshaped, just as profoundly, the physical form of the landscape itself. The scholarly field of landscape studies takes up the daunting challenge of disentangling and interpreting the various aspects of its significance for us.

A fine survey of current efforts in this field is provided by Jeff Malpas in The Place of Landscape. Malpas believes that "only a plurality of answers and approaches can begin to do justice to the iridescent and often opaque character of landscape" (xii). Accordingly, he has assembled a set of essays on landscape by scholars in a wide range of fields, including philosophy, art history, sociology, anthropology, geography, religious studies, and cultural studies. This pluralism extends not only to methodology, but also to theoretical positions on landscape. In this regard, Malpas positions the book squarely as a reply to W.J.T. Mitchell's influential Landscape and Power (1994) which inclined toward analyzing landscape primarily through a quasi-Marxian political lens, seeing it as a nefarious ideological tool. Whereas these political approaches tended to emphasize what John Barrell called 'the dark side of landscape', many of the writers in Malpas's volume emphasize positive dimensions of our experience of landscape.

Although Malpas aims to display a plurality of methods for studying landscape, he does place a special emphasis on the philosophical or, as he puts it, the 'conceptual investigation' of landscape. This approach, he says, has been under-represented in recent work, and Malpas dedicates the first third of the book to it. The authors in this section investigate the really fundamental questions about the nature of landscape and its significance for human life. In the second section, authors tackle problems that, while also conceptual or philosophical, are somewhat narrower or more focused than the general investigations of section one. Here we follow writers as they try to understand the sublime, analyze the place of landscape in Christian thought, and reappraise the picturesque. The third section is dedicated to studies of specific representations of, or responses to, particular landscapes.

This methodological division is a thoughtful arrangement of the material and throws the different approaches into often revealing contrast with one another. The first and explicitly philosophical section opens with a reappraisal of landscape painting. In his own contribution, "Place and the Problem of Landscape", Malpas opposes the view that landscape painting puts us in a detached, disengaged, and often misleading relation to actual landscapes, hence revealing nothing about our actual relations to them. Arguing that landscape art often emerges from, and contributes to, active involvement with real landscapes, Malpas sees landscape painting as a genre of continuing relevance. An assumption underlying his argument is that through our experience of landscapes, we "engage with our own mode of being in the world". Malpas does not develop this idea further in his piece, but the claim for the existential importance of landscape is subsequently taken up (with respect to actual landscapes, as opposed to landscape painting) by the philosophers Edward Casey and Theodore Schatzki. The latter, in his essay "Landscapes as Temporalspatial Phenomena", draws on Heidegger's philosophy to argue that our subjective conception of landscape is determined by our aims and goals (and, so the reasoning goes, by time). Casey's piece, "The Edge(s) of Landscape", focuses on the significance of different sorts of edges, or boundaries, in our experience of landscape.

Despite Malpas's attempts to highlight the importance of more philosophical approaches to landscape, however, this section of the book is the least satisfying of the three. Schatzki and Casey both deploy an array of technical philosophical terms and distinctions, but these ultimately seem to shed more heat than light. Schatzki, for example, develops his analysis of landscape in terms of the notion of 'activity timespace', which he glosses as: "the dimensionality of human proceeding in place, where by place I mean the 'open, cleared, gathered "region" or "locale" in which [people] find [themselves] along with other things". (65) As Schatzki explains it, this boils down to the familiar fact that we relate to landscapes in terms of how they serve our aims and figure in our practices, so that we see a path not simply as a strip of gravel but as the route to town, or a bench not merely as some wood and nails but as a place to sit and watch birds. This is obviously true in general, and surely has some significance in regard to how we relate to landscapes. For example, as Schatzki notes, it seems connected to landscape's significance in cultural memory. But his Heideggerian musings do little to illuminate these connections and seem beside the point. Casey's study of edges also delves into some heavy metaphysics, with similarly underwhelming results. Of the Earth, for instance, Casey concludes that "as a visible and tangible lower bound, it acts as a telluric a priori for the perception of landscape" (98). Stripped of philosophical jargon, this seems nothing more than the trivial claim that we couldn't perceive any landscapes if the Earth did not exist. Things only get murkier as Casey goes on to posit mysterious "edge energies" that supposedly build up along the edges of things.

Part of the difficulty here is that, despite Malpas's admirable pluralism, a very narrow sample of contemporary philosophical work on landscape is included in the volume. None of the entries in section one draw on work on landscape in the analytic philosophy of the last fifty years, including the work of major figures such as Ronald Hepburn in Britain and Allen Carlson and Arnold Berleant in North America. Environmental philosophy is also entirely excluded. Readers unaware of this work would come away from Malpas's volume with a quite misleading view of the range of philosophical thought on the topic. Actually, among the more interesting of the pieces in section one are those by non-philosophers: Wesley Kort's "'Landscape' as a Kind of Place-Relation" and John Bradley's "'Whitefellas Have to Learn about Country, It is not Just Land'". Kort discusses the enduring religious impulse to find spiritual meaning in nature, and Bradley describes indigenous cultures with senses of place distinct from, and perhaps richer than, our own. The indigenous Australians that Bradley describes have a sense of landscape that encodes their lived experiences and world-understanding, and without which they literally "do not know how to behave". While these essays do not spell out a philosophical theory of landscape as such, they do remind us of the importance of providing such a theory and of some of the possibilities open to us in doing so.

The second section of the volume moves on to discussion of more specific issues. In "Garden, City or Wilderness? Landscape and Destiny in the Christian Imagination", Philip Sheldrake surveys Christian treatments of different landscape types. He emphasizes the variety of Christian thought on these topics, concluding that, overall, Christianity rejected the strong associations between God and particular landscapes that was characteristic of Judaism, stressing instead dislocation and movement. In contrast, J. Nicholas Entrikin's "Geographic Landscapes and Natural Disaster" takes a scientific perspective, providing an interesting survey of the history of the concept of landscape in geography. He argues that the term has two basic senses, one cultural and one physical, that ultimately cannot be reconciled. He points to natural disasters as the events that make this irresolvable duality most vividly manifest. In "The Political Meaning of Landscape", familiar political issues are put in a new framework as the cultural geographer Bernard Debarbieux uses Arendt's categories of labour, work and action to analyze landscape. Although conceding that many contemporary landscape practices are 'trivialized' and 'narcissistic' and constitute forms of alienation, he also finds positive political potential in landscape. When the form of a landscape is determined by collective desires and needs, he argues, landscape can be a site of action in Arendt's sense.

Familiar aesthetic categories get a fresh look in the papers by critical theorist Andrew Benjamin and philosopher Isis Brook. In "Entry and Distance: Sublimity in Landscape", Benjamin undertakes a reworking of Burke's sublime into "a refusal of the literal" (157). In experiencing the sublime, he asserts, we fail to see the object of our attention as "a self-completing and thus self-identical object engendering a singular and unequivocal experience". (157) In this essay the more 'philosophical' mode of investigation of section one unfortunately reemerges, with Benjamin's jargon-heavy discussion making few concessions to the reader. More satisfying is Isis Brook's "Reinterpreting the Picturesque in the Experience of Landscape". Writing lucidly about the picturesque, which Ruskin called the most obscure concept outside of theology, is not easy. Brook, however, mounts a lively and cogent defence of the eighteenth-century cult of the picturesque, arguing that, despite its sometimes ridiculous excesses, it did much to foster an improved appreciation of nature.

The book's third and final section consists of historical and critical studies of particular responses to, or representations of, landscapes. Reinhard Steiner's impressive piece, "'All foreground without distance': The Rise of Landscape in Late Medieval Painting", turns the focus back to landscape painting. He argues that a conception of landscape as a unifying space, which was itself subject to aesthetic appreciation, preceded the development of linear perspective during the Renaissance. Steiner makes his case through a careful analysis of specific paintings and draws connections between the dawning sense of landscape and broader intellectual developments, such as Petrarch's experiences of the alpine landscape and the influence of philosophical views about space and 'action at a distance'.

The next two papers turn their attention to film. In "Landscapes of Class in Contemporary Chinese Film", Stephanie Hemelryk Donald discusses the cinematic use of landscape in two recent Chinese films. She explains how these films treat landscape in relation to issues of modernization, migration and lost sense of place in post-revolutionary China. More philosophical in tone is Ross Gibson's "Searching for a Place in the World: The Landscape of Ford's The Searchers". Gibson's piece is a wild, poetic interpretation of The Searchers, sparked by the idea that cinema radiates some kind of 'energy' causing us to see inanimate things as alive. Gibson links this to religious pantheism and the notion that film gives us a new, 'non-Western' sense of space and time. But the basic idea here -- and it is a suggestive one -- is that, through certain cinematic techniques, directors can make us identify with the landscape itself. Gibson works out this idea through a shot by shot analysis of the opening of Ford's film.

The theme of a personal identification with the landscape carries into the next piece, Katie Campbell's "Framing the Landscape: The Anglo-Florentine View". In this well-researched and well-written essay, Campbell offers a vivid snapshot of the love of Florentine landscape among wealthy English intellectuals in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. Campbell offers a thoughtful reappraisal of their attitude to the landscape. She acknowledges that, in many senses, theirs was the 'sickly love' of nature born from the upper class English cults of Romanticism and the picturesque. She also highlights the troubling political implications of these flights of picturesque fantasy in the Florence of the 1930s. But she also finds redeeming qualities in their genuine, if somewhat idealistic, love for the Florentine landscape.

With Campbell's essay, however, sympathy for romanticized views of landscape runs out. The final two essays, Michael Rosenthal's "This Green Unpleasant Land: Landscape and Contemporary Britain" and Nigel Everett's "The Lie of the Land: Reflections on Irish Nature and Landscape", are, as their titles suggest, unsubtle and scathing indictments of the romanticizing attitude. Both essays target popular television shows on the meaning of landscape to the national character. In his piece, Rosenthal takes on a BBC program on the English landscape and English landscape painting. Rosenthal argues that such nationalistic uses of landscape painting turn it into a simplistic symbol, reducing a people's culture to a meaningless and politically charged 'national heritage', which is then used to drive environmentally and economically exploitative commercial development. Everett's essay mounts a similar critique but, interestingly, from the opposite end of the political spectrum. His target is an Irish TV program portraying the Dereen estate of Kerry and its 'un-Irish' exotic plants as emblematic of English colonialism. This use of landscape in the Irish nationalist historical narrative, Everett insists, seriously distorts the historical reality.

Neither of these essays is easy going; Rosenthal's piece in particular is marred by pedantic analysis of the BBC program and some rather grumpy academic score-settling. Nonetheless, their critiques of the simplistic, sentimentalized conceptions of landscape that are now a commonplace of tourist industries everywhere ring true. Their contributions show that the older, and more cynical, mode of analyzing landscape as ideology has not lost its potency, or its relevance.

On the other hand, however, there does seem to be something distinctly unsatisfying about these essays. No doubt this is due in part to Malpas' clever decision to place the Rosenthal and Everett pieces at the end of this volume, for they come across as very one-sided indeed when juxtaposed against the broader range of approaches that have come before. The reader is left to wonder: once these ideological critiques have burned away all nostalgia, all sentimentality, all pretentions to a national pride in, or cultural identification with, the land, what is left? The almost desperate need for something more rings out clearly, in fact, at the end of Rosenthal's essay, where he expresses the desire for a more transcendent relation to landscape, but, almost in the same breath, bemoans its utter impossibility.

But there is no need for despair, for the various essays in The Place of Landscape provide us with a rich range of suggestions for what a more positive relation to landscape might look like. The omission of important contributions from philosophy and environmentalism mean that The Place of Landscape doesn't quite live up to its title's promise of a snapshot of the place of landscape in contemporary thought. Nonetheless, Malpas's volume is an impressive and thoughtfully arranged collection that shows the richness and vitality of landscape studies. It will surely be engaging and stimulating reading for anyone trying to understand the enigma of landscape.