Early Greek Philosophy, 9 Vols.

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André Laks and Glenn W. Most (eds., trs.) Early Greek Philosophy, 9 Vols., Loeb Classical Library nos. 524-532, Harvard University Press, 2016, 4196pp., $234.00 ($26.00 each), ISBN ISBN 9780674996540, 9780674996892, 9780674996915, 9780674996922, 9780674997066, 9780674997073, 9780674997080, 9780674997097, 9780674997103.

_____, Les débuts de la philosophie, Fayard, 2016, 1674pp., €70.00, ISBN 9782213637532.

Reviewed by Jason G. Rheins, Loyola University Chicago


After more than a decade of collaboration in arduous and painstaking labor, André Laks and Glenn W. Most [LM] have given us these 9 volumes [EGP] and their simultaneously produced, single-volume French edition [Débuts]. Before any other comment, criticism, or comparison is made, I think it is a reviewer's obligation -- though by no means an unpleasant one to meet -- to recognize what a significant achievement the work in question represents. It is an up-to-date, comprehensive collection of biographies, doctrines, reception, and cultural-intellectual background for ancient Greek philosophers and philosophy from the end of the VIIth to the beginnings of the IVth centuries, BCE. The work spans 9 volumes and some 4196 pages in the Loeb editions, and the more than 4000 passages have been edited (or the latest and best editions have been consulted and reviewed) and translated into two modern languages: the lingua franca and, well, the lingua franca. They have taken familiar material and often presented it in challenging and refreshingly unfamiliar ways; and they both offer and encourage a more source-critical, historical approach to early Greek philosophy without losing sight of its enduring philosophical significance.

Laks-Most and Diels-Kranz

New Material

When a comprehensive edition and translation of Greek philosophy prior to the IVth c. BCE is brought forth -- a rare occurrence given the enormous scope of such an endeavor -- it is natural to ask how it compares with and whether it ought to replace what has been the standard in the field for more than two thirds of a century: Walther Kranz's revised and completed edition of Hermann Diels' magisterial Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker [DK], sixth edition, published in 1951. LM have no stated ambition for EGP to replace DK, but if they did, theirs might be the first work to be a truly promising contender. Significantly larger than DK in terms of sheer material, EGP includes, inter alia, the following material not in the former:

  • The whole of the Derveni Papyrus;
  • An Empedocles chapter incorporating the Strasbourg Papyrus;
  • A substantial section on Socrates;
  • Two chapters of background material on philosophically significant, early speculation found in Greek poetry regarding the cosmos, the gods, and humanity;
  • Numerous chapters and chapter sections collecting reflections on and receptions of early Greek philosophy and its key figures in later philosophy and in contemporary and subsequent comedy, tragedy, and early medical writings.

Just over 20% of the passages in EGP are not in DK (818 of 4061, by my count).[1] And often these supplements offer previously under-emphasized or elided themes. To give but three noteworthy examples:

  • THAL. D2 -- in which Galen states that he cannot find a claim that water is the only element (stoicheion) in the Milesian's treatise (sungramma), despite its being everyone's view.
  • PYTH. a. P17a,b -- Neo-Platonists' reports of 'Orphic' influence on Pythagoras in his account (logos) of the gods and his knowledge of rituals (orgia), respectively.
  • PROD. D14 -- a report by Didymus the Blind that Prodicus denied the possibility of contradiction (antilegein).

There are many such passages, and for the sake of this kind of material alone, EGP is now an essential resource for scholars working on the texts, themes, and figures of early Greek philosophy. It ought to begin to assume a place as DK's co-equal complement. However, it is difficult to say that EGP should supersede DK, precisely because it is not 'DK 2.0'. It would have been no small task to have produced a 'Diels-Kranz-Laks-Most', i.e. a collection that stood to DK as DK stood to Diels' Fragmente: one that was essentially the same as DK but with a significant number of new additions and with English and French translations for the fragments and the testimonies alike. But this is not that. EGP is very different from what a hypothetical 'DKLM' would have been and is far more valuable to the study of ancient philosophy than such a work ever could have been. LM have carefully thought about, reflected upon, and reevaluated the vast array of material that they present.

The freshness of their treatment is evident in numerous ways, beginning with their editorial choices and translations. Take Parmenides. In PARM. D6 they choose to combine fragments DK B2 and B3, which is a daring but not unjustifiable choice, as the latter metrically completes the former and the two quotations are mutually illuminating. They also present together B7 and B8 (which Diels had separated) as D8. Their translations of that long portion of the Way of Truth are challenging, but appropriately so. It is harder to parse Parmenides' meaning and argument in their renderings than in many others, but this is a success of their translation precisely because Parmenides' sense is highly elusive and frequently uncertain. Thus, the translations' readers are in a position much closer to that of the reader of Parmenides' confounding Greek, and less of the work of interpretation has been preempted by the translators.

EGP's intellectual independence from Diels-Kranz is also present in the structure of the work; it differs from DK in at least four major ways:

  • Rejection of the category 'Pre-Socratic Philosopher'
  • Replacement of the A/B system with P/D/R and T
  • Greater inclusion of 'reception' and an elevation of its status
  • Chapters with select background material

The Elimination of 'Pre-Socratic' and the Inclusion of Socrates

From its very choice of title, Early Greek Philosophy resists the influence of the concept 'Presocratic' and the 'discontinuist' narrative of Greek thought that it implies.[2] This is to say LM do not accept several of the faulty assumptions that justified the division of 'philosophers' into the categories pre- and post-Socratic.[3] Socrates may have introduced several major innovations into moral philosophy or philosophy generally such as the search for definitions, but Greek philosophy before Socrates did not fail to treat of ethical and political topics, nor did ongoing philosophical debates and traditions cease at his birth, acme, or death. Socrates is not an ideal temporal marker; for example, there is no chronological sense in which Democritus is 'Pre-Socratic', but what collection would dare exclude him? The most one can say is that prior to the Socratic Dialogues of Plato and Xenophon our access to the texts of Greek philosophy is almost entirely fragmentary.[4]

This reorientation affects the collection in numerous ways large and small, but by far the greatest impact comes from the inclusion of Socrates in the volumes on the Sophists. Arguably the philosopher whose historical study suffers most from the 'Presocratic' concept is Socrates himself. Treating Socrates as the seminal figure for the 'inward turn' or the development of dialectic serves the hagiographical image of Plato's Socrates -- an intellectual exemplar and philosophical founding father admittedly very dear, even integral, to our traditions, But it does little to give us a clear and unbiased assessment of who the enigmatic historical Socrates might have been, what he did, and how he was seen by the intellectuals and laypeople of his day who were not his followers. If we suspend the credulity with which we accept the accounts of history's victors, it becomes difficult to say from the outside why it is that Socrates' thought and practices were 'philosophical', but those of, say, Antiphon or Prodicus were 'sophistic'.[5]

Moreover, whatever it was that Socrates was doing was part of the fabric of the late Vth century's philosophy and culture, both reflecting the interests and ideas of his contemporaries and reverberating back on them. For example, suppose Plato and Xenophon are right that Socrates did not profess views or conduct investigations 'looking into the things down in the earth and up in the heavens'. Does that mean that Aristophanes and the average Athenian conflated two different groups of intellectuals: 'naturalists' and 'sophists'? Or, does it suggest that these types regularly comingled and often were coextensive? We frequently take the first option for granted while we ought to take more seriously the second. And, if Socrates went further and disavowed aspects of the study of nature (as in Xenophon's depiction[6]), then that fact has a very different significance if we think of Socrates as one of the sophists and/or party to their debates. Among other things, it would suggest a debate in 'sophistic' circles similar to a concurrent one in the field of medicine about the extent to which the expert can function independently of natural philosophy. Simply put, Socrates was an early Greek philosopher, and our picture of early Greek philosophy is better if, as in EGP, we consider him as a part of it rather than apart from it.

A/B is out, P/D/R is in

Second, LM have eliminated the practice of dividing and presenting separately testimonia -- DK's 'A' entries -- from so-called 'fragments', viz. the 'B' entries, which are meant to be direct quotations of the philosophers' words. While the practice of dividing testimony from fragment had the benefit of making us wary of excessive credence in and reliance upon secondary sources, it was also problematic. Starting with Diels, who only translated the 'B' texts, many editions of individual figures either declined to translate the testimonia or they translated them but omitted their original sources. But whether it was simply separating As from Bs, leaving As untranslated, or omitting the original text from As, this led to an undue avoidance of testimonia and a (relative) overreliance on 'fragments'. It could also lead to an undue confidence in Bs. This, too, was problematic. While testimonia might call for even more critical discernment, we cannot safely ignore the context in which and the purpose for which a fragment is transmitted to us. It is all too easy to think that because we have X's own words we are beyond any influence from our source for X in how we understand these words. Nor are Bs -- which sometimes are no longer than a single word -- always more informative or reliable than As. Often a given fragment is unintelligible without certain other testimonia. Or vice-versa. All of which tells in favor of placing "fragments" and "testimonies" on the same subjects side-by-side, which is what EGP has done. I believe that interpretations will be enriched and improved as a result.

That is not to say that EGP ignores the distinction between paraphrase and quotation. Where they are confident that the words we are reading are ipsissima verba, LM have them in bold-face. But rather than the A, B, (and sometimes C) scheme of DK, the chapters organized around key figures are typically divided into: P (person, biography), D (doctrines), and R (reception). Some of the substance of the old debates over A v. B may be recaptured in the decision to embolden more or less of a given passage or the distinctions between P, D, and R passages. Consider XEN. D66 (DK B8):

Already seven and sixty years have been tossing about
            My thought throughout the land of Greece
And at that time there had already been twenty-five more since my birth,
            If I myself know how to speak truly about such things.

The information Xenophanes affords us here is biographical. It is invaluable for establishing his chronology and his professional activity as an itinerant poet after the Persian invasion of Ionia, but it tells us little about his doctrines. And yet it finds its way into D rather than P because it is a verbatim quotation of Xenophanes' own poetry. Thus, D sections include but are not limited to nearly all cases of ipsissisma verba, doctrinal or not. I say 'nearly' because sometimes one can find them in the R sections, too. But, in the grand scheme of things, that is a quibble. The more important lingering worry is that the separation of D from R displaces rather than eliminates the worry of taking some information as 'the straight dope' while leaving other material under a cloud of suspected bias. Yet such judgments surely must be drawn at some point, and LM exercise good judgment.

The more important point about the R sections is not that they are divided from P or D, but that they are present in the collection in the first place. The R sections contain an enormous amount of material not in DK which is invaluable not only for understanding how early Greek philosophy was understood by its Greek and Roman philosophical inheritors but also for understanding how certain interpretations of their thought still with us today first arose. The chapter on Heraclitus is particularly excellent in this regard. One realizes upon reading the R sections that much -- too much -- of what one might have assumed about Heraclitus is in large part a product of his frequent re-appropriation by Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, and others.[7]

Background Chapters

The title of the nine volumes is revealing in one other way: it is Early Greek Philosophy, not Early Greek Philosophers. This deemphasis of the organization around personages is warranted by both the ample amount of anonymous material we confront -- e.g. the Derveni Papyrus, Anonymous Iamblichi, etc. -- and the echoes of early Greek philosophy in the poetic and medical literatures which we often cannot link with certainty to any one philosopher, but which nevertheless reflects earlier or contemporary philosophical currents. I do think an opportunity was missed to give Solon his own chapter, and another for the seven sages (without Thales and Solon). The Peripatetic collections of their sayings are included in the collection (chapter 3), but they are too easy to overlook.

In these chapters, as elsewhere, LM guide the reader with sub-headings, but try not to be too imposing or prejudicial when it comes to telling readers what they are looking at. At times, though, the 'gentle touch' approach may be more misleading than an explicit justification or explanation of an editorial division would have been. For example, in chapter 3 (the second chapter of background material in Vol. II), 'Reflections on Gods and Men', T 32-34 are grouped together in a sub-section with the heading 'The Afterlife'. They consist of excerpts from Pindar (T 32a-e), bone tablets from Olbia (T 33a-c), and the famous Orphic gold tablets from Hipponion (T 34). Now, 'The Afterlife' is an unfortunate way to title these three sets of selections. They all are views about the afterlife, of course, but they are specimens of a distinct class of views within that much broader genus of Greek eschatological perspectives in the VIIth-Vth centuries BCE. This trio consists of what used to be called 'Orphic' eschatology. That term is no longer considered a safe one, and I suspect that the overly generic designation for these texts was designed to avoid prejudging any debates about the validity of the 'Orphic' concept. All the same, describing them as 'the Afterlife' and not including other views distorts the less-informed reader's sense of prevalent Greek views of the afterlife. What would really be best would have been a slightly larger set of selections that give a broader sense of the range of early Greek views of the afterlife. One would expect at least one or two excerpts from Odyssey XI, the 'Nekyia', which famously depicts the post-mortem soul as a pitiable ghost (literally a shade of its former self) with the ghost of Achilles' unforgettable pronouncement that it is preferable to be a poor man's slave than to rule over all the dead. (The account of the soul of Odysseus' crewman or the appearance of the ghost of Patroclus in the Iliad would also be welcome Homeric inclusions.)

Another important subcategory would be the Vth c. BCE belief that we find especially well attested to in the last third of the century in Athens: that the soul (psuchē) or mind (nous) is a breath/spirit (pneuma) made of a stuff that is drawn from and ultimately returns to the bright aether of the upper sky.[8] In the Memorial Inscription of 432 BCE to the soldiers who died at Potidaea we find:

'The aether has taken up their souls, but their bodies / this land.'[9]

The following lines from Euripides' Suppliant Women (423 BCE) ll. 531-6 nicely supplement the inscription, suggesting that when the body returns to the earth and the spirit to the aether they are returning to their original sources:

Come! Let the dead be covered by the ground,
And let each part regain the element
From which it came to light: the spirit, to the aether [sic];
The body, into the earth. The flesh is only ours
To dwell in while life lasts; and afterward
The giver of its strength must take it back.[10]

In fact, one finds this view repeatedly expressed in Euripides' fragments and extant plays.[11] Its prevalence may even speak to the influence of Anaxagoras or other late natural philosophers such as Diogenes of Apolonia.[12]

This leads me back to the point about headings. In chapter 43, 'Philosophy and Philosophers in Comedy and Tragedy (DRAM.)', under the heading 'Reflections of Anaxagoras', T 78 quotes one such passage from Euripides' lost Chrysippus (fr. 839 K) and compares it to ANAXAG.D15. The latter is a passage that claims that nothing is truly created or destroyed, but various substances are mixed and separated at different times. Now, the idea that certain root materials are forever preserved is present in DRAM. T 78, but the focus of the chorus at that point is on the twin material and divine origins of mortals: Heaven and Earth. Our human bodies come from and return to the earth, but another part of us (which we share with the gods) comes from the aether and returns there. Left in isolation from the other Euripidean texts and instead placed alongside other passages about cosmic recycling, the allusion to the soul or mind as the offspring of aether is easy to miss, and with it the psychological and eschatological upshot of the Chrysippus fragment is lost.[13] Thus, despite their relatively 'light touch', these headings can shape interpretation.

On the whole, LM have assembled this collection with a critical but generous spirit that takes seriously the importance of reception and tries to prejudge no topic as irrelevant. At the same time, the background chapters are highly selective. Selectivity is a necessary evil, and every selection is sure to leave unsatisfied those who feel that some aspect of Greek thought or culture has been overlooked or overemphasized.[14] So be it. What is unusual about EGP though, is that remarkable comprehensiveness sits side-by-side with ruthless selectiveness. All the chapters in EGP are highly informative and valuable; judging by the standard of 'What must one absolutely know to begin to understand Early Greek Philosophy?' it is a success. But there is a kind of duality of audiences: the chapters containing 'background material' are, by necessity, extremely selective, such that they do seem designed more for the students just beginning to immerse themselves in early Greek thought, while the chapters on the individual figures are replete enough to dependably serve the scholar and potentially overwhelm the student. I mention this not so much as a criticism but as one final example of the novelty of this collection. For I think EGP challenges one's expectations about what ought to be in such a collection and whether it really should aim at exhaustiveness in all things.

Ease and Difficulty of Use

For advanced undergraduate and graduate level surveys of early Greek philosophy, this collection should become essential. Things stand a little differently for undergraduate survey courses on ancient Greek philosophy where one can seldom afford Pre-Platonic thinkers more than a month if one must also progress in the same term through Plato and on to Aristotle or even further. The Fayard single volume edition is still an excellent choice for French language students or for classical language courses in which students are expected to read Greek and Latin, but it might be asking too much of most students to purchase all nine Loeb volumes for three to five weeks of instruction. It is very fortunate, therefore, that the Loeb Classical Library is now accessible online. If one's university is a subscriber, having one's students access the volumes electronically is an excellent option.

Nine volumes can also be unwieldy. Here, the single volume French edition is the scholar's friend, too. Whereas many passages that are whole in DK are divided in EGP, and because many entries for one early figure are also passages for another, one is frequently required to cross-reference between chapters or even volumes; with nine books, this can become rather laborious. Currently these cross-references do not function as hyperlinks in the Loeb Classical Library online edition. If they were to link to the referenced passage (or, better still, if they could expand with the text of the passage embedded), it would vastly improve the collection's user interface.

In addition to hyperlinks in the online edition, there are a few other things that could be done that would make the collection significantly easier to use. It would be very helpful to have an index fontium to let the reader know ahead of time where, if at all, a specific passage can be found in the collection. This is especially relevant when it comes to the background chapters. Does one contain the Potidaea Inscription? Or, take some famous reflection by Euripides on wisdom and false-wisdom: will I find it in chapter 3? Or 42? Or 43? Or not at all?

Also, at the start of each chapter there is a helpful conspectus giving the list of topics or themes: e.g. for the D section of Anaxagoras:

All Things Are in All Things (D22-D25)
Mind (D26-28)
Cosmogony (D29-D32)
Cosmology (D33-D52)
            The World Order (D33-D35)
            Astronomy (D36-D52)
                        Aether (D36-D27)
                        Sun and Moon (D38-D45)
                        Other Heavenly Bodies (D46-D49)
                        Comets and Meteors (D50-D52)

This would be a natural place to give abbreviated citations of the relevant passages. (Perhaps the matching DK numbers for those passages found in both could also be given, but this is less necessary given the concordances in vol. I.)

Final Reflections on EGP

I have tried to stress the ways in which EGP is not merely a repository that gathers together early philosophical texts but is a fresh perspective and even an orientation to the study of early Greek philosophy. The kind of approach it suggests is not only a critical one, but also a humanistic one, where one is guided to seek as much contextualization through time and in place as possible. I would predict that those who come to rely upon EGP to teach and study early Greek philosophy and philosophers -- and I hope it will be many of us -- will produce work that is:

  1. Supplied with textually superior editions of the material we read.
  2. Better grounded in, better informed by, and more alert to the literary and cultural context of archaic and early classical Greece.
  3. Well-versed in doxographical testimony, and better acquainted with ancient traditions of reception, and, therefore, more sensitive to the challenges and more open to the opportunities afforded by taking seriously issues of reception.

In short, I think that EGP, used correctly, will provide a model and a vital tool for historians of Greek philosophy to be better historians and critics. This need not make the historian of philosophy any less a philosopher. Certainly no one is a better philosopher for being less well-informed and less critical a judge of the past; the historian of philosophy's work need not perforce be any less philosophical if it is more historical. But it does suggest that she and her work will be philosophical in ways both markedly and subtly different than before.

As philosophers we seek the universal. As historians we examine the particulars. Without some insight or message that transcends their own particularities, historical facts are irrelevant and unedifying. But, without some appreciation of the historical circumstances in which human beings formulate their ideas, the abstractions we derive from history will be ill-informed and rationalistic; at the same time, without the context of history our present intellectual pursuits are prone to becoming naïve and parochial. Fortunately, viewing the works of human reason and imagination in their historical time and cultural place need not undercut their universal relatability, nor cordon them off so that they become irrelevant antiquarian curiosities. On the contrary, seeing how reason and imagination actually operated in the past prepares us to understand better their operation today and to appreciate better the applicability or inapplicability of ancient concepts and theories to modernity. When we reveal the sometimes incredibly alien, yet sometimes stunningly familiar thoughts and aspirations of a culture whose arts, letters, and sciences are ancestral to our own, using such resources as they could muster to address the intellectual and social problems they faced, we widen the range of intellectual possibilities to which we ourselves are open and alive, thereby rendering the conventions and conceptual circumstances of our own frameworks more conspicuous and our philosophical endeavors more historically conscious.

Put another way: the growing attention to reception in the humanities represents a synthesis of Renaissance Humanism with Modern Criticism. This aspiration is successfully realized in EGP.

[1] For details, see these tables

[2] André Laks, The Concept of Presocratic Philosophy: Its Origin, Development, and Significance. [Concept] Tr. Glenn Most. (Princeton, 2018), pp 79ff.

[3] Concept, 19-34.

[4] For Gorgias we have the Encomium of Helen and the Defense of Palamades, and if Antiphon the Sophist and Antiphon of Rhamnus are one, as LM believe (IX, 2-3) then the Tetralogies count, too. Cf. Concept, 32-34.

[5] We know that the late 5th and 4th centuries BCE were host to fierce and on-going debates about the shape and scope of advanced learning: i.e. which ideas, activities, practices, and skills counted as 'philosophy' or 'wisdom', on the one hand, and which were 'sophistry' and 'false learning', on the other,  The Platonic-Aristotelian model of philosophy as theōria won out, while both Socratic and non-Socratic models of philosophy as e.g. ask­­ēsis or rhetoric or politics were ultimately defeated. The victors' depictions of their martyred progenitor Socrates has been dominant for twenty-two centuries.

[6] Memorabilia I.1.8-9, 11-16.

[7] I am grateful for a presentation by Brad Inwood on the reception(s) of Heraclitus at a symposium honoring the completion of EGP at the University of Chicago in early 2018.

[8] See Bremmer, The Rise and Fall of the Afterlife, 7.

[9] αἰθὲρ μὲμ φσυχὰς ὑπεδέχσατο, σόμ[ατα δὲ χθὸν]/ το͂νδε·

[10] Tr. F.W. Jones with slight changes. ἐάσατ' ἤδη γῆι καλυφθῆναι νεκρούς, /ὅθεν δ' ἕκαστον ἐς τὸ φῶς ἀφίκετο/ ἐνταῦθ' ἀπελθεῖν, πνεῦμα μὲν πρὸς αἰθέρα,/ τὸ σῶμα δ' ἐς γῆν· οὔτι γὰρ κεκτήμεθα/ἡμέτερον αὐτὸ πλὴν ἐνοικῆσαι βίον,/   κἄπειτα τὴν θρέψασαν αὐτὸ δεῖ λαβεῖν.

[11] It is also found in an unidentified play twice quoted by Plutarch (F 971), and Erechtheus F 370.70-1, and Helen (1013-6). In the latter two, the ascent to the aether occurs after or instead of punishment in Hades.

[12] At any rate, it was believed so by those who identified Euripides as one of Anaxagoras' auditors. Heraclitus Grammaticus (Quaest. 22.10, 1-11, 6) refers to it as a 'Clazomenaean' dogma spoken by Euripides (i.e. one he learned from Anaxagoras).

[13]'τὰ μὲν ἐκ γαίας φύντ' εἰς γαῖαν, /τὰ δ' ἀπ' αἰθερίου βλαστόντα γονῆς/εἰς οὐράνιον πάλιν ἦλθε πόλον' 9-11.

[14] I cannot resist mentioning one painfully felt absence from the chapter 29 on Early Greek Medicine. The 'Hippocratic' Airs, Waters, Places has excerpts in this chapter, but the theme in chapter XVI (and again in XXIII) of the respective contributions of climate and government to the characters of Greeks, Europeans, and Asians is not considered. That is a shame, for not only does this text raise an idea of (Proto-Lamarckian) acquired, heritable traits, but it also wades into the nomos/phusis debate by suggesting that climate plays a far smaller role in regional character traits than forms of government. The upshot is the insight that (for the most part, at least) it is slavery that makes men slavish, rather than natural slavishness that predisposes them to slavery.