Early Modern Aesthetics

Placeholder book cover

J. Colin McQuillan, Early Modern Aesthetics, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 191pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783482122.

Reviewed by Dabney Townsend


J. Colin McQuillan's short book on early modern aesthetics is neither a history nor a critical discussion, though it attempts to be something of both. It also ventures farther afield to discuss questions of hermeneutics, especially the relation of history to the way that one should read philosophical texts from earlier periods. McQuillan's own summary of what he thinks he has achieved highlights the exploration of "early modern debates on the ancients and moderns, the fine arts, and the critique of taste, as well as the emergence and transformation of aesthetics in the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries" (135). He acknowledges that he has not produced a history of early modern aesthetics. As he says,

This sketch of early modern philosophy is far from complete. I have not said anything about the differences between the rationalist and empiricist traditions and their implications for philosophical and scientific method; I have not mentioned the debates about syllogistic reasoning and the place of mathematic in philosophy; nor have I discussed the different conceptions of force and motion that philosophers and scientists employed (4).

Furthermore, the book is selective in which philosophers it discusses. While Kames and Gerard are treated, there is no mention of Archibald Alison or Thomas Reid, who are more significant figures in the Scottish Enlightenment, and Voltaire, whose essay on taste was translated and printed with Gerard's essay, does not appear in the index, though he is in the bibliography. So, for a way into early modern aesthetics, one would do better to go to the first volume of Paul Guyer's A History of Modern Aesthetics (in spite of its ridiculous expense; we have been promised a paperbound edition.)

McQuillan's concern with hermeneutical issues focuses on where one finds aesthetics as such and how one should incorporate discussions of poetics, criticism, and theories of the arts into aesthetics proper. He writes in his preface,

My primary concern in this book is to avoid these detrimental forms of anachronism; provide a more authentic account of the history of aesthetics than is found in much of the scholarly literature; and separate philosophical discussions of beauty, art, literature, and criticism during the early modern period from the part of philosophy that came to be called aesthetics, so each of these discussions can be given their due by philosophers (x).

He considers himself a contextualist for whom historical reading informs and corrects interpretation. This is hardly a radical view, but it is also not completely clear. For example, when McQuillan writes "Throughout this book, I have argued that aesthetics did not exist as a part of philosophy until the eighteenth century" (148); this actually is just equivocation on the term 'aesthetic' rather than the historical hermeneutic that is intended. His worries over the term 'aesthetic' and its extension can be resolved by more careful attention to what is being argued and what one is led to conclude. It is useful to know how and why Baumgarten introduced his neologism, and it is important to follow how Kant transformed it and incorporated it into a systematic treatment of taste in the Third Critique. But that does not in any way prevent one from reading Plato or Aristotle or Plotinus on beauty as thinking about the kind of issues that early modern philosophers were grappling with. One seeks an understanding of one's own experience and of what earlier writers thought. The two are intertwined. It is not the either/or that McQuillan seems to imagine. When he says that "Those who believe that the thing [aesthetics] existed before the name are sure to deny that aesthetics was really invented during the eighteenth century," there is an essentialist presupposition lurking behind the objection. 'Aesthetics' does not exist; what one has are problems, couched in the vocabulary of a particular writer who is trying to understand something. We are trying to understand the same thing or something similar and at the same time the writer's way of understanding it.

Philosophy is neither timeless (perennial) nor time bound. Because it is expressed in language and because our understanding is corrected and enhanced over time (modern logic really is superior to Aristotelian logic in its scope and understanding of quantification, for example), one must pay attention to the language and its historical context. But because experience is still experience, one still asks many of the same questions and wishes to either confirm or refute similar judgments. It is never either/or except maybe in pure logic. One could hardly disagree with the claim that "greater clarity and greater accuracy can be achieved by recognizing the historical specificity of aesthetics, paying attention to the place it occupies in the systems of modern philosophy, and understanding the institutions on which it depends" (150). But "historical specificity" does not trump understanding of the issue with which one is concerned. There are multiple ways of understanding. That, I think, is different from the kind of pluralism for which McQuillan seems to argue.

The four central chapters in the book are titled "Ancients and Moderns," The Fine Arts," "The Critique of Taste," and "Aesthetics." The conclusion extends the discussion to a more general consideration of "modernism." Each chapter includes both brief surveys of some of the significant issues and writers on the subject without trying to be complete.

The chapter on the ancients and the moderns surveys a wide range of figures without a great deal of exposition. Sometimes it lumps together issues that are not clearly the same. For example, antiquarian and scholarly issues are not the same as the issues of critical judgment (27). More seriously, it is not always clear exactly how something like Swift's Battle of the Books is relevant to the philosophical issues that occupied early modern writers on criticism and taste. The claim is that "While these discussions are not properly 'aesthetic,' they represent an earnest and modern attempt to comprehend the arts within philosophy" (34-35). The problem is that they are not the issues that are raised by Shaftesbury and Hume in Britain or Diderot and d'Alembert in France. Hume's problems with the ancients, for example, is not whether they are superior literarily to modern writers but whether the same moral rules apply. Swift is writing satire; Hume is practicing a form of philosophical criticism. To work out the relevance of the one to the other (and they are relevant) requires more than McQuillan allows space for.

The chapter on the fine arts takes up the issues raised by P. O. Kristeller in his classic essay, "The Modern System of the Arts." That discussion has gone through many stages since 1951, and it still occupies historians of ideas. The attempt to show whether a "system" of the arts existed before the eighteenth century is controversial -- see, for example, James O. Young's extended introduction to his recent translation of Charles Batteux's The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle. McQuillan summarizes the literature without attempting to resolve issues that ultimately led, he thinks, to Kant's system. However, sometimes the summaries reduce to a kind of Cliff Notes: "Classical works on architecture like Vitruvius's On Architecture (ca 27) and Renaissance treatises like Alberti's On the Art of Building (1486) remained influential during the early modern period" (44). The writers on the arts in the early modern period were only just beginning to work out the implications of separating the fine arts from craft and patronage, and that required a more independent understanding of what constituted a "fine art" than had existed earlier if artists were to gain the independence they sought. Those issues deserve more attention than McQuillan can give them in his survey.

The chapter on taste reaches back to Francis Bacon and Julius Caesar Scaliger in the sixteenth century and forward to Herder and Kant at the end of the eighteenth. It recognizes the centrality of theories of taste and the importance of a standard of taste in early modern philosophy. It is somewhat misleading, however, in focusing on genius, which did not become central until late in the century. Gerard's Essay on Genius was something of an afterthought to his Essay on Taste.

The chapter on aesthetics brings McQuillan to his central concern with whether aesthetics existed prior to Baumgarten's and Kant's adoption of the term. Here there is a much more detailed exposition of Baumgarten and Kant and especially of Baumgarten's relation to Wolff and Georg Friedrich Meier that contrasts with the thumbnail sketches elsewhere. These texts are so complex, however, that much more would be needed. Some issues, for example the difference between Stefanie Buchenau's judgment of the significance of Baumgarten and Guyer's interpretation (102) are rather at odds with the level of exposition elsewhere and probably will puzzle most readers.

The concluding sections of the fourth chapter drift rather far afield from early modern aesthetics: "In the fourth and final section, I discuss the attempt by twentieth-century philosophers to determine the proper subject of philosophical aesthetics: whether it is aesthetic properties, aesthetic attitudes, aesthetic experiences, or something else" (103). It is certainly true that "debates about the subject matter of aesthetics continued throughout the nineteenth and twentieth centuries," (122) but as McQuillan implicitly acknowledges, after Kant, they take different forms and are conceptually different. That is not to say that early modern aesthetics is not relevant, but the relevance needs to be explicated in terms of the new conceptual terminology and structure that comes after Kant. One finds Kantian disinterestedness only nascently, if at all, in early modern philosophy. McQuillan provides little more than a platitude: "By studying the history of aesthetics and the way these different subjects came to be incorporated into philosophy and into aesthetics as a part of philosophy, we might also discover conceptual relations between them we had not anticipated" (124).

The final brief chapter, "Early Modern Aesthetics Now," is more about "modernism" in its various forms and usages which vary widely across the arts, history, and philosophy than it is about early modernism in the way that period is discussed in the history of philosophy. It extends the discussion, however briefly, to Irving Babbitt, T. S. Eliot, Marxist criticism, evolutionary aesthetic theories, and Jacques Rancière's Aisthesis. It is a plea for McQuillan's underlying thesis: "So I am convinced that greater clarity and greater accuracy can be achieved by recognizing the historical specificity of aesthetics, paying attention to the place it occupies in the systems of modern philosophy, and understanding the institutions on which they depend" (150). How could one not agree, providing "historical specificity" does not mean historical isolationism?

I think that this book tries to do two different things. On the one hand, it tries to survey early modern philosophy as it relates to taste, beauty, and criticism of the arts. In that respect it is uneven. It is best on German rationalist aesthetics from Wolff to Kant and beyond into Romanticism, though the last is only by extension part of early modern philosophy. It is rather superficial on core issues arising from the shift from Aristotelian presuppositions to empiricist foundations, particularly the British and French enlightenment adoption of experience as the sole basis of knowledge. On the other hand, it argues for a form of historical hermeneutics that is specifically concerned with the aesthetic as it emerged in late early modern philosophy with Kant. McQuillan wants to be an historicist in the sense that all philosophy is historically situated and culturally circumscribed. That is a deeper issue than the history of early modern aesthetics, and the attempt to incorporate both topics into the same book cannot do justice to either. One would have to have two books, both much more extensive than this brief one. That is to ask for books that McQuillan was not trying to write. It is good, however, to have more attention paid to early modern philosophy, which is truly seminal for twentieth and twenty-first century philosophy, including aesthetics.