Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions

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Tad M. Schmaltz, Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Oxford University Press, 2016, 382pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190495220.

Reviewed by Steven Nadler, University of Wisconsin-Madison


In 1854, Francisque Bouillier published the first edition of his magisterial two-volume Histoire de la philosophie cartésienne. It was an exhaustive study of Descartes's philosophy and its influence. Bouillier begins with Descartes's "precursers" in late medieval and Renaissance thought; surveys the main themes in Descartes's own writings; follows the dissemination of Cartesianism in France, the Netherlands, Germany, Italy, England and elsewhere; studies the philosophy's many partisans and critics; and finally traces the steps to its ultimate downfall. The scope of Bouillier's work is spectacular. He covers two centuries and an entire continent, and he leaves the reader with a rich and detailed picture of the great diversity among Descartes's followers, as well as their philosophical, religious and political opponents and the passions and controversy that Cartesian philosophy generated right from the beginning.

Tad Schmaltz's aim in this book is, by his own account, much more modest. His study is limited to two countries: France and the Dutch Republic (the United Provinces of the Netherlands), without question the most important domains for Cartesian philosophy in the early modern period (and the two countries that can both legitimately claim to have been Descartes's "home"). Moreover, most of Schmaltz's attention is focused on the seventeenth century, although he covers some material that extends into the eighteenth century. Still, while Bouillier may take the prize for geographical and chronological scope and a larger cast of characters, Schmaltz cedes little when it comes to thematic breadth. As for philosophical depth, here Schmaltz surpasses his nineteenth-century predecessor.

Both the title and subtitle give away much of his thesis. One question (and several sub-questions) sums up the motivating problem behind Schmaltz's book: What did it mean to be a Cartesian in the seventeenth century? Is it a matter of starting one's philosophizing with the cogito? Did one have to identify body with extension or adopt Descartes's account of the "beast machine" (whereby non-human animals do not have souls but are merely parcels of matter operating according to the principles of the mechanical philosophy)? Did one have to believe that the eternal truths were created by God with an arbitrary will? Was a commitment to occasionalism required? Schmaltz doubts that any of these items is necessary. He is skeptical "that there is any set of principles that all and only recognized members of the 'Cartesian sect' adopted during the early modern period" (137).

In fact, for Schmaltz there was no single thing that could be called "Cartesianism" in the seventeenth century -- not in or near Descartes's lifetime, and certainly not in the second half of the century. Contrary to what Leibniz would have us believe, the Cartesians -- for Schmaltz's purposes, Descartes's French and Dutch disciples -- were not just offering paraphrases of their philosophical mentor. There was great variety in what they chose to keep and what they chose to discard from Descartes's epistemology, metaphysics, and science. According to Schmaltz, being a Cartesian in the seventeenth century was not so much a matter of accepting certain required paradigmatic features of Descartes's system, but rather a matter of sharing a particular historical and philosophical pedigree or line of dissent (much in the way, Schmaltz suggests, in which the members of a biological species are united). To be a Cartesian was also to belong to a particular social and intellectual network that self-identifies with Descartes himself, in part by self-consciously continuing his general philosophical project, albeit not always in ways which Descartes would recognize or even sanction. The goal was to complete, modify and/or correct Descartes's philosophy -- above all, to salvage it as it faced condemnation and competition throughout the rest of the century and especially into the next.

So much for the Cartesianisms. The operative word in the subtitle is 'constructions'. For as Schmaltz shows, the varieties of Cartesianism in the period are generated by the creative ways in which later figures built on their philosophical inheritance. "What matters is not so much what Descartes himself intended to say but how others received and transformed what he had to say" (11). Cartesianism was not simply passed on or adopted by Descartes's partisans. Rather, they constructed it, and the results often differed in significant respects.

Schmaltz begins with an overview of the tricky theological terrain Descartes and Cartesians had to navigate. The problems came from both the Catholic and the Protestant sides. Catholic theologians (and their academic and political allies) were especially concerned with the apparent incompatibility of the Cartesian account of body with the real presence of Christ's body in the transubstantiated Eucharistic host. If matter is nothing but extension and all the properties of body are simply modes of extension that are inseparable from the extended substance to which they belong, then how is it possible for the "accidents" of bread and wine (color, taste, odor, etc.) to remain after the bread and wine have been consecrated and their substance replaced by the substance of Christ's body and blood? Protestant theologians were less concerned about this -- since they did not accept the "real presence" of Christ in the host anyway -- than they were with the problem of liberty. Descartes at times appears to allow that human beings, through the exercise of free will, were responsible not only for epistemic errors but moral ones as well. Allowing human sin or salvation to rest on human freedom, unaided by divine grace, was anathema to Calvinists. At the same time, Catholic theologians were afraid that Descartes's account of the will left it insufficiently free, thus appearing to concede too much to the Calvinist view.

It is quite a trick to be able to cause consternation to both Catholics and Calvinists on one and the same issue, but the complexities of Descartes's somewhat reluctant explanation of Eucharistic transubstantiation and the ambiguities in his views on freedom had just this virtue (and they continue to puzzle scholars today). Later Cartesians had to wrestle with these questions, as well as with Descartes's peculiar views on the status of the eternal truths, and did so in diverse, often incompatible ways, depending upon where they were operating. The controversy over Cartesian teaching in Louvain in the early 1660s (leading to Descartes's works being placed on the Catholic Church's "Index of Prohibited Books" in 1663) was very different from the stiff opposition the philosophy faced in Paris in the early 1670s.

Cartesians also dealt with Descartes's relationship to the "old" philosophy -- especially Aristotelianism -- in different ways, depending upon the obstacles that they faced in disseminating his ideas. Schmaltz shows how they chose different strategies in France and the Netherlands according to the nature of the challenge. In the Netherlands, where academic Cartesians were seeking to reform the Scholastic curriculum from within, they relied on an "insider" strategy, portraying Descartes's philosophy as continuous with that of the "ancients". By contrast, in France, where Cartesian thought was initially "ignored in the French schools", they opted to bypass academic authorities by "appealing directly to the common person" (69). Thus, in Utrecht and Leiden, the Cartesians began insinuating themselves into university faculties, whereas in Paris and elsewhere they were based mainly in salons and private academies.

With these matters of historical-political-theological context and strategy out of the way, Schmaltz turns in the rest of book to particular Cartesians and Cartesianisms. Rather than organizing these chapters by person or geography, however, as Bouillier did, Schmaltz opts for a thematic approach. This serves him and the reader well.

In the chapter "Augustinian Cartesianisms", Schmaltz takes up the challenge posed by Henri Gouhier and, more recently, Stephen Menn of determining just how much Descartes's philosophy owes to or has in common with that of Augustine. Schmaltz notes that Descartes himself "appears to have had no sense that his search for metaphysical foundations was specifically Augustinian in nature" (126). However, what he is especially interested in is the extent to which disputes among later Cartesians are informed by just this question as they confronted "difficulties that emerged from the attempt to negotiate an alliance between Augustine and Descartes" (122). Indeed, the greatest Cartesian event of the second half of the seventeenth century -- the bataille royale between Antoine Arnauld and Nicolas Malebranche -- was in good part a debate over the proper way to interpret and integrate the two philosophies.

In "Cartesian Occasionalisms", on the other hand, the focus is on the early modern attempts to fix the Cartesian philosophy itself -- in particular, making sense of natural causation as consistent with both Descartes's metaphysics of mind and matter and a proper understanding of God's role in creation. Schmaltz is a superb guide to the dialectic here, offering a fine nuanced view of the varieties of occasionalisms among more or less orthodox Cartesians. We are now far from the old textbook account that seventeenth-century occasionalism was simply an ad-hoc response to a mind-body problem bequeathed by Descartes, as well as the view that one was either an occasionalist or one was not. There were thoroughgoing occasionalists, such as Malebranche, GĂ©raud de Cordemoy and, arguably, Arnold Geulincx; partial occasionalists -- that is, occasionalists in one domain or another (mind to body, body to mind, body/body) -- like Arnauld and Louis de la Forge; and those who have often been taken for occasionalists but in fact were not, such as Johannes Clauberg. Through a careful examination of the different kinds of arguments at work in occasionalist texts, Schmaltz is able to shine some light on who rightly or wrongly deserves to be counted among the ranks of occasionalists and to what degree. As he puts it,

These Cartesians were no more unified around a particular form of occasionalism than other early modern Cartesians were unified with respect to several major issues broached in Descartes's writings. What united the various Cartesian occasionalisms was rather a concern to develop and integrate certain themes from Descartes in a way that allows for the survival of a defensible Cartesian theory of causation. (227)

The chapter on occasionalism is followed by a pair of more narrowly focused (thematically and geographically) chapters. Schmaltz's examination of Cartesianisms in Dutch medicine begins with Descartes's own mechanist physiology and scientific method, and then considers the legacies in such Dutch Cartesians as Henricus Regius, Johannes De Raey, and Burchard de Volder, as well as the Frenchmen Pierre-Sylvain Regis and Robert Desgabets. The final chapter is devoted to Cartesianisms in French physics, with appearances by Regis, Jacques Rohault and Malebranche as well as the French critics of Cartesian physics. These last two chapters present the more empirical side of the science found in both Descartes and his followers. The end of the story is well known, of course, since Newtonianism slowly but surely won the day (although France, naturally, was the last holdout).

There are some lacunae in this book, as there will be in any study with so broad a scope. Schmaltz's discussion of the Arnauld-Malebranche debate, as good as it is, curiously leaves out its most important aspect -- the disagreement over the nature and operation of divine grace. After all, the famous exchanges over the metaphysics and epistemology of ideas were only a prelude to the more important battle over God's modus operandi in the realms of nature and grace -- does God act by particular or general volitions? -- the efficacy of divine volitions, and the relationship among God's attributes. I also missed a discussion of Cartesian moral philosophy, something that is quite relevant to the occasionalism of Geulincx. Schmaltz briefly mentions the Stoic background to Geulincx's views on the will's power over the body, but that is about it for ethics in this book. Schmaltz could also have provided more than the brief mention he makes of the way in which Malebranche's occasionalism forced the Oratorian to modify Descartes's physics, especially the laws of motion. This would have been a valuable addition to the chapter on Cartesian physics.

These are very minor criticisms, however. Overall, Schmaltz succeeds admirably in complicating -- and I mean this in a good sense -- our view of early modern Cartesianism. The story he tells, with great scholarly care, adds nuance to our understanding of what was happening in the seventeenth century when we turn our attention from marquee figures like Spinoza, Locke and Leibniz and consider the philosophical journeymen who worked hard to keep Descartes's system -- if not in all its details -- vital.