Early Modern Women and the Problem of Evil: Atrocity and Theodicy

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Jill Graper Hernandez, Early Modern Women and the Problem of Evil: Atrocity and Theodicy, Routledge, 2016, 148 pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781138122345.

Reviewed by Karen Detlefsen, University of Pennsylvania


The past couple of decades have seen a rapid increase in excavating the works of early modern philosophers whose texts and ideas have been hitherto lost to history. The result has been an increasingly inclusive history of our discipline. One area of research that has been especially lively is the philosophical works of early modern women. There are significant advantages to this trend, such as our gaining a fuller and more balanced understanding of our intellectual past, and our ability to offer an historical view of philosophy that is friendlier to a wider swath of the students we teach in contemporary universities and colleges. Another advantage (a perhaps somewhat surprising one) is that the philosophical insights of these women working from roughly the 1600-1800s can often provide help in thinking through problems that philosophers today are beginning to theorize. Indeed, on questions to do with women's lived experiences -- questions that form a good portion of contemporary feminist philosophy -- early modern women often have insights that sound remarkably contemporary.

Jill Graper Hernandez's book is a wonderful addition to this trend. Hernandez starts with a contemporary problem for those interested in philosophy of religion, specifically those engaged with thinking through evil, and turns to insights of a range of early modern women in order to find productive ways to move forward with this problem. In recent years, a specific way of thinking about the problem of evil -- the "atrocity paradigm" -- has posed significant challenges within the philosophy of religion. Wielded especially by atheists -- although, importantly, acknowledged by some theists, too -- the atrocity paradigm characterizes evil in a way quite different from more traditional ways of thinking about it, a new characterization that lends great power to the atheist's belief that such evil is incompatible with the existence of a perfect God. Hernandez's project in this book is to bring atheists and theists into productive conversation with one another over the atrocity paradigm, and she does so by showing how a number of early modern women were -- 300-400 years ago -- well aware of atrocious evil, and yet were committed theists. If a recognition of atrocious evil and a belief in a perfect God could co-exist in individual thinkers, then perhaps the philosophy of religion of those thinkers could show us in the 21st century ways of having productive conversations about evil and God. As such, it is a book that will appeal to a range of scholars and students, including those working in contemporary philosophy of religion, women's studies, and history of early modern philosophy, and including faculty, graduate students and advanced undergraduate students.

But what is the atrocity paradigm? One way of answering this question is to look at how the problem of evil has been more traditionally treated in the history of philosophy, including in the early modern period, most famously by Leibniz (9ff). As Hernandez characterizes this traditional treatment, evil is seen as "an abstract, logical category" that "removes human agency away from the horrors produced by evil" (x; c.f. 1). Traditional "[t]heodicy which evaluates only the logical compatibility of divine existence with an abstract evil misses just what it means to suffer, and what it means for an individual to feel as though God has abandoned her in her suffering" (5); Leibniz's Theodicy in particular directs its energy "toward the logical rather than the evidential claims" (10) about the impact on human life of evil. In neglecting horrendous harms visited upon individuals, traditional accounts of evil lead to further troublesome consequences. One such consequence is that "Tying 'evil' to God removes it from human agency and culpability and leads to a rhetoric in which the oppressed are told to value suffering" (6). Hernandez later particularizes this latter problem, writing that "redemptive accounts of suffering have been used to oppress those who already suffer. The Church itself has, passively or actively, perpetrated the suffering of women (and other minorities)" (14). Traditional accounts of evil, and attempts to ensure the existence of a perfect God despite the existence of evil, have generally been offered, Hernandez points out, by those in positions of "social and epistemic privilege" (xi) -- that is, by those who are far less likely to suffer and experience systematic harm associated with occupying social positions that invite systematic harm and suffering.

By contrast, the atrocity paradigm takes a different approach to the problem of evil. One of my few quibbles with this book is that Hernandez's account of atrocious harms (or horrendous evils, or the atrocity paradigm) is a bit diffuse and thus slightly hard to get an immediate grip on. Still, in the opening chapter, the following picture of the atrocity paradigm emerges. On page 19, for example, Hernandez provides this definition: according to "today's atrocity paradigm", "concrete evils stem from systems of injustice, and so are preventable, culpable, create intolerable harm, and threaten the great good of someone's life". Several key elements of the atrocity paradigm are captured by this definition. First, evil is conceived of as systematic (x), often coming about as a result of "human institutions which propagate systematic injustices" (xi; cf. 4) including political, religious, legal and social systems (7). These systematically perpetrated harms are pernicious and avoidable -- and inexcusable because avoidable (2). Moreover, they are intolerable because they deprive people of a decent life and suppress human flourishing (x, 2). Unlike the abstract treatment of evil and its supposed logical compatibility with a perfect God, those attuned to atrocious or horrendous evils believe that their approach to evil can "speak to those who truly suffer from atrocious harms", as well as speaking "from the perspective of those who suffer" (xi), and as such, philosophers writing with the atrocity paradigm in mind "engage with the lived experience of suffering" (4). Given the connection between institutional and systematic injustice and atrocious evil, the atrocity paradigm is more often than not speaking to and from the perspective of socially and epistemically opposed people, such as women, who are prone to the harms of systematic evils that undermine human flourishing. Because of the atrocity paradigm's focus on systematic harms that are institutionally anchored, those interested in grappling with atrocious evils concentrate less on particular acts of evil perpetrated by individuals and concentrate more on entire "genre[s] of harms against humanity", including, for example, "racial cleansing, rape, genocide, bombings of children, and hate crimes" (2). Theists grappling with evils that fall within the atrocity paradigm cannot rely as naturally upon the "free will defense" or the "best of all possible worlds defense" against evil (8), but rather, need to turn to new ways of accounting for evil whilst retaining theist commitments.

With this contrast between traditional accounts of evil and the atrocity paradigm in mind, Hernandez turns to the central business of her book: examining how Mary Hays, Catharine Macaulay, Mary Astell, Margaret Cavendish, and Mary Wollstonecraft (Hernandez notes that there are many, many other early modern women whose work could be equally well called upon to illuminate the problem of atrocious evil) can help contemporary philosophers grapple effectively with this alternative way of thinking about evil. These women share both the atheist's understanding of evil as theorized by the atrocity paradigm (which indeed undergirds the atheist's lack of belief in a perfect God) and the theist's belief in a good, indeed perfect, God. By turning to the work of these women, Hernandez hopes to chart a way forward by, at the least, finding conceptual space for atheists and theists mindful of atrocious evil to engage in productive debate about God, evil, and human responsibility. In addition to this pay-off for contemporary philosophy of religion, Hernandez's project has the additional virtue of contributing to an expanded history of philosophy. Our philosophical forebears not only give a fuller, more anchored account of the nature of evil than we have thus far recognized, but they also show how some forms of evil have disproportionately affected women and minorities. Crucially, Hernandez is not engaged in a project that genders evil, but rather, she is engaged in a project that situates it (45). As Hernandez frames it, she provides "evidence first, that these [early modern] women believed that evil and harm were systematically grounded and . . . atrocities; and secondly, that the early modern concrete examples provided here of systematic harm are also examples of institutional injustice today" (25).

In chapter two, Hernandez examines four examples of "institutional harms, rather than individual concrete harms" (27), examples she argues are identified clearly and forcefully by the five early modern women listed above. These four classes of systematic, institutionalized evils that cause great suffering and undermine the flourishing of women -- that is, these four classes of atrocious evils -- are the domestic abuse of men over women, or patriarchal abuse (28-33), the abuse of political power by the selfish men who hold it, resulting in the subordination of justice to power (33-36), rape and its long-lasting and devastating impact upon women (37-39), and the suppression of women's equal right to education (39-44). Hernandez does a wonderful job of showing how these examples of harm are -- and are understood by the early modern women to be -- systematic and institutional harms. On rape, for example, she writes:

A critic might argue that rape, as a worse-case example of concrete moral evil, is not really a proper example of structural evil that produces atrocious harm. Rape might be egregious and a violent immoral act, but most injustice (and so, most evil in the world) is not brutal . . . But for these women, rape is the perfect instance of concrete [atrocious] evil because it demonstrates the powerlessness of women in any system where women are treated as property, rather than as equal partners in the created order. (38)

Also, throughout this chapter, Hernandez delves into issues of central interest to philosophers in the early modern period such as human nature, including mind-body relations, the rise of the ideal of human rights, and the role of the passions in human life. As such she proves herself an astute and contextually-sensitive reader of early modern texts, even while showing their continued relevance to philosophy today.

Chapter three further connects, in a textually-grounded and non-anachronistic fashion, past insights found in the philosophies of early modern women with contemporary projects in philosophy. In this chapter, Hernandez turns to insights from contemporary standpoint epistemology to explicate a kind of "situated, experiential knowledge" that is "also important to narrative theodicy: not a knowing that, but a knowing-from-the-stance-of-which" (52). As a result of focusing on the nature of narrative and knowledge that can emerge from it, Hernandez engages with a topic that is enjoying increasing attention among philosophers interested in the work of women in the early modern period, namely the question of the nature of philosophy itself, and the many forms that philosophy might take. Hernandez focuses on literature and the narrative, story-telling form therein, in order to show how early modern women are able to convey effectively their situated, "knowing-from-the-stance-of-which" knowledge of atrocious evil. She also argues that narratives "allow believers to share stories which provide reasons for why God allows some people to suffer" (55). Central to this chapter is Hernandez's careful investigation of various points of view and perspectives, settling on the unique power of first person plural narratives to address atrocious evil and our consequent relations with our fellows who commit evil as well as with God. The first-person plural is effective in cases where "the standpoint concerns itself with the intersubjective, relational aspects between agents . . . [the hearer of a story told from this perspective] engages with a story in which the characters are interrelated (as a 'we'), she regards the story as an experience she could share with other members of her community (i.e. the 'we')" (71). Hernandez thus effectively acknowledges the attunement that many early modern women philosophers have toward the relational aspects of human life and the practice of philosophy therein.

So, chapter three uses the works of early modern women philosophers to underscore that, depending upon the nature and purpose of philosophical content, different genres and methods may be called upon to practice philosophy in especially effective ways. Chapter four offers yet other ways in which these women's work provides helpful insights. As Hernandez points out, the five women who demonstrate a clear understanding of what we now call atrocious evil were also believers in a perfect God. While these five do not set out to provide theodicies, one can nonetheless find a number of theodicean arguments in their texts -- arguments intended to justify God's goodness in the face of evil, and which fare better against the challenges posed by atrocious evils than do the standard arguments offered by, for example, Leibniz. Hernandez details three kinds of theodicy found in these women's philosophies -- what she calls Virtue Accounts (86-92), Natural Balance Accounts (92-96), and Transmuted Accounts (96-104). The last account seems especially prominent in Hernandez's own thinking about atrocious evil and God's goodness, for at the outset of the book, she underscores the importance of transmuted goods to her overall project. There is

a forceful moral system, perpetrated by human action, which can work against the impact of atrocious harm. We'll call this system 'transmutation' . . . The system of atrocity produces life-altering demise in the people who suffer from horrendous evils, but if there is a system of transmutation, it is possible that the demise wrought by the atrocity can be replaced by something qualitatively different, something good . . . Atrocious harms result from human interference with the world, and humans are to blame when they come about. Similarly, transmuted goods require human action to be produced, and we ought to laud humans when they come about. (16)

Certainly, in many early modern women philosophers, we see passionate and creative ideas for social and political change to ameliorate the impact of atrocious evil, and for women to find ways of escaping the systematic and institutional harms visited upon them, thus demonstrating the kind of laudable activity for the good that Hernandez identifies. Just as certainly, one (an atheist, for example) can surely challenge this, and other theodicean attempts within these women's philosophies. Hernandez herself (chapter five) considers a range of objections one might bring against her project. But finding flaws and raising objections is to be expected when faced with rich and interesting philosophy. And reinvigorating an old philosophical debate by breathing new life into it is precisely the goal and the outcome of this terrific book.

Hernandez's book succeeds on a number of fronts. It is fresh, creative and brimming with exciting ideas and connections among a range of philosophical ideas. It is an important contribution to the New Narratives in the History of Philosophy [1] project (also called The Recovery Project[2]), which aims at cultivating a more inclusive, and thus more exciting, history of philosophy. This book engages seriously with the problem of atrocious evil, and therefore engages seriously with a powerful atheist position, and it does so in such a way as to cultivate productive philosophical debate between the atheist and the theist around problems of central social concern. The book also engages the present with the past of our discipline in genuine, non-artificial ways, both treating the past in its own terms while also showing the continued importance of texts and ideas that have been too long neglected by our field.

[1] Housed at Simon Fraser University under Lisa Shapiro's leadership.

[2] See Sandrine Bergès's website. See also, Project Vox initiated by Andrew Janiak, Ruth Hagengruber's History of Women Philosophers and Scientists, and the Center for New Narratives in Philosophy under Christia Mercer's leadership.